Tense Bees and Shell-Shocked Crabs: Are Animals Conscious?

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Michael Tye, Tense Bees and Shell-Shocked Crabs: Are Animals Conscious?, Oxford University Press, 2017, 256pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190278014.

Reviewed by Colin Klein, Macquarie University


Most of us are willing to accept that some nonhuman animals are conscious. Primates and dogs are an easy sell. Once upon a time, it was also easy to draw the line at mammals. The past few decades have revealed surprising complexity and intelligence among vertebrates like fish and birds, however, and even the higher invertebrates such as the octopus. More recently, cautious claims have appeared on behalf of simpler invertebrates like insects and crabs. Yet does the cleverness of the honeybee really give us reason to think that it has phenomenal consciousness?

Michael Tye argues for the affirmative. Arguing from straightforward principles, he comes to the conclusion that consciousness is widespread. Along the way, he marshals an impressive array of empirical evidence, focusing on the traditionally overlooked corners of the animal world.

The book can be divided into three parts. The first five chapters cover general issues on consciousness, which lays the groundwork. Then come four chapters which are (more or less) on specific issues in animal consciousness. Finally, two chapters return to traditional philosophical concerns. I will note from the outset that the style is not high analytic philosophy. It is rather more akin to D.M. Armstrong's "Opinionated Introductions" or to Tye's own Ten Problems of Consciousness. Arguments are presented to fit Tye's agenda, and do not go into the depth that one would expect from a book aimed solely at professionals. The upside is that the book is extremely clear and lively. The didactic style would make it ideal for teaching, particularly to an upper-level undergraduate class.

After a general introduction in Chapter 1, Chapter 2 defends the "Simple View" that a creature is conscious only if it is having experiences, and that mental states are conscious just in case they are experiences. Along the way, Tye takes time to dispatch higher-order theories of consciousness and to dispute whether "access consciousness" deserves the name. Chapter 3 introduces Descartes and Turing, and pushes back against conceptualism about experiences. All of this is important ground-clearing before we get to simple animals, though (as I'll argue) it is not entirely innocuous.

Chapters 4 and 5 are meatier. Tye's argument is notable for being primarily epistemological rather that metaphysical: although he has a theory of consciousness, it plays no particular role here. Instead, he presents a story about why behavior gives us evidence about an organism's experiences, and the strength and role of that evidence. Tye notes in Chapter 4 that a weak functionalist commitment ensures that (all things being equal) the same experiences cause the same sorts of adaptive behavior. This is a setup for the heavy lifting, which is done by what Tye calls "Newton's rule." Newton's rule states that, as a general rule of thumb, "The causes assigned to natural effects of the same kind must be, as far as possible, the same" (72). So if we observe a behavior in an organism, and the same behavior is caused by a conscious state in us, we ought to attribute the same conscious state to the organism as well.

I'll use C for the proposition that the organism feels the same state. Tye states that the warrant we get for believing C is a basic entitlement, without need for further support (63fn7). Further, what we get is rational preference for C (rather than ~C); that level of confidence may not be enough to get us up to full-fledged belief in C (74). Finally, learning that C is defeasible, other information can undermine it. While these caveats seem reasonable separately, I had trouble seeing how they were meant to be combined. Do defeaters merely push us back to agnosticism, or give us positive reason to believe ~C? Do other pieces of evidence merely change our confidence in C? But if that's the case, why have a default-and-challenge epistemology in the first place? I suspect that some of my unease with later chapters really stems from this unresolved tension.

I have two larger quibbles with this approach as it is applied to animal consciousness. First, Newton's rule is not the only game in town. The ethologist C. Lloyd Morgan famously suggested that:

In no case is an animal activity to be interpreted in terms of higher psychological processes if it can be fairly interpreted in terms of processes which stand lower in the scale of psychological evolution and development. (Morgan, 1903, 59)

What is now known as Morgan's Canon has been enormously influential. I think the biggest flaw of the book is that it contains no discussion of Morgan. Not that I'm a fan of Morgan's Canon: I think it has held back the study of nonhuman animals, and there are plenty of good reasons to reject it. Yet Morgan's canon is the obvious dual of Tye's principle: one says no consciousness without a good reason, the other says consciousness unless good reason otherwise. But whereas Tye's presentation of Newton's rule makes it clear that it needs immediate and obvious hedging, a great number of ethologists still accept an unqualified version of Morgan's canon. Ethologists are rightly wary of uncritical anthropomorphism, and Morgan's canon is supposed to provide some sort of inoculation against this error. Whether a suitably qualified version of Newton's rule can play the same role is an open question.

Second, I'll note that once Newton's rule is on the table, the identification between consciousness and having experiences is no longer as innocuous as it might seem. Together, they imply that one can receive largely piecemeal evidence for consciousness in any organism. Tye defends his principle via the problem of other minds. I agree that it is uncontroversial that, upon seeing Adam writhing on the ground clutching his ankle, we can infer that Adam is probably in pain. But Adam is very much like us, and so we have many reasons to think he has a general capacity to have subjective experiences, of which his particular pain is just one instance.

Yet fans of Morgan's canon will (I suspect) be underwhelmed when we move from humans to animals, because consciousness seems like one of those "higher psychological processes" that we might generally do without when it comes to animals. That is, if we think there are good reasons to quite generally deny consciousness to animals, then evidence about particular behaviors is neither here nor there. To be fair, much of Chapter 5 is devoted to arguing against the standard of evidential support for such a view, namely the fact that we humans have a large neocortex. Tye reviews evidence that anencephalic children -- those born (almost) entirely without a cortex -- still feel many experiences. While not uncontroversial, I find this evidence reasonably persuasive.

So much for the big picture. The next three chapters apply these general principles to empirical literature on animals. Chapter 6 (and to an extent the close of 5) focus on fish and the current debates over whether fish feel pain. The brief Chapter 7 extends that argument with similar evidence about birds. Chapter 8 gets into harder cases even further from home, like bees and crabs. Chapter 9 then tries to figure out where to draw the lower line: ought we include protozoa and plants among the conscious?

A wealth of empirical examples are found in these chapters, of the sort guaranteed to generate classroom discussion. The discussion of insects and arthropods is especially welcome. There is a widely-held view that insects are mere bundles of reflex, capable only of simple stimulus-response behavior. (My biologist colleague complains wearily that vertebrate neuroscientists rarely realize bees even have brains!). This simple view is increasingly untenable. The past two decades have been a fertile time for work on insects, particularly bees and fruit flies. It is staggering what a honeybee can achieve with a million neurons, and Tye gives a great run through some of the recent work on this. Some of the focus is on more traditional markers like emotions and standing states like pain. However, there is also a welcome discussion of complex behaviors such as delayed match-to-sample (149ff) which appear to need more complex underlying machinery.

Any individual example is still likely to be contentious as evidence for consciousness, however. That is inevitable. To apply Newton's rule, one still needs to determine what counts as similar behavior and what is a defeater for the inference. Tye professes unconcern about the former, arguing that we can give suitably neutral descriptions that abstract away from radically different body plans (77). I'm not so sure.

As a simple case, consider Tye's example that morphine reduces threat response to noxious stimuli in both bees (135) and crabs (156). Is this evidence that these animals feel pain which was then relieved by morphine? Or is their lack of motion merely a response to the sedative properties of morphine, akin to the somnolence of an addict on the nod? Conversely, consider the fact that insects will tear off a limb to escape being trapped. Tye considers several different interpretations of this fact (137ff). Yet the fact that insects do this at all depends on a deeper physiological difference: as chitin does not regrow, insects have no incentive to preserve a badly damaged limb. That makes their lives, and their relationship to any pain they feel, very different to ours.

These are familiar problems from ethology. To Tye's credit, he takes these debates seriously. Yet I suspect that piecemeal discussion is part of the problem. Without some background theory about what we're looking for, the skeptic simply digs in: what counts as relevant similarity, or a good defeater, remains very much up in the air.

This is most evident in Chapter 9, discussing the lower bound of consciousness. Tye suggests that protozoa and plants don't have conscious states (he wavers on caterpillars, despite having apparently extended consciousness to the arthropods in the previous chapter). We are told that protozoa and plants are not complex enough to produce flexible behavior -- they lack nervous systems, after all -- and that's that. But of course, similar claims are made about insects. Further, there is recent evidence that plants can do something like associative learning (Gagliano et al., 2016), which some authors take as evidence of plant consciousness. I doubt that any of this is good evidence for plant consciousness. But this is one of the places where I feel that Tye has painted himself into an epistemological corner.

The final two chapters return to more traditional philosophical ground. Chapter 10 considers consciousness in robots -- Commander Data and suitable artificial rabbits are in, while the case of Ned Block's Nation of China is less clear. Here, as in many of the preceding chapters, much attention is paid to pain experience and a roughly functionalist account of what it would take to feel pain. Tye's well-known work on pain serves him well: welcome attention is paid not just to the immediate expression of pain (which could perhaps be faked) but the long-term consequences of pain behavior for guarding damaged limbs and learning for the future.

Chapter 11 concludes with the upshot for animal ethics. This is largely a review of potential positions one might take about animal welfare, with attention to positions that are unapologetically speciesist. There is an argument for vegetarianism which I haven't seen published and which I was delighted to find has ancient roots. Tye draws from the 3rd century neoPlatonist Porphyry, who claimed that it is unjust to destroy sentient beings for mere "luxury" and "enjoyment of pleasure." As vegetarianism is perfectly possible these days, justice demands that we refrain. Tye (and I) find this a powerful argument. Of course, if insects really are conscious, the calculation becomes more complex. As Fischer (2016) notes, agriculture kills an absolutely staggering number of insects, and so even strict vegans have trouble balancing the books. That aside, it is fitting that this argument comes, as it does, at the end of a book devoted to the complexity and wonder of sections of the animal kingdom mostly overlooked in ordinary ethical discussions. This is a book rich in empirical examples, which is sure to generate discussion and controversy on a timely topic.


Fischer, Robert (2016). "Bugging the Strict Vegan." Journal of Agricultural and Environmental Ethics, 29:255-263.

Gagliano, Monica et al. (2016). "Learning by Association in Plants." Scientific Reports, 6:38427.

Morgan, C. Lloyd (1903). An Introduction to Comparative Psychology.  The Walter Scott Publishing Compnay, Ltd.