Terms and Truth

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Berger, Alan, Terms and Truth, MIT Press, 2002, 251pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262025191.

Reviewed by Robin Jeshion, Yale University


Alan Berger’s new book, Terms and Truth, makes a major contribution to the development of the new theory of reference. This theory, initiated by Kripke, Kaplan, Donnellan, and Marcus over thirty years ago, aims to explain how ordinary proper names and some general terms refer to objects in the world without appealing to a descriptive meaning or Fregean sense. The reference is supposed to be in some way “direct”.

Although the new theory of reference (NTR) has, arguably, become the dominant semantic theory, many questions remain alive. The most pressing perhaps are those that focus on how it can be that reference is direct, especially in situations in which a speaker uses a name (or certain other general terms) to refer yet has not herself ever in effect “tagged” the name to its referent by focusing on that referent, and, indeed, in many cases has not and cannot focus on the referent (as in our reference to Aristotle). The name’s referent is supposed to be secured – somehow – because the speaker stands in some historical or causal communication-chain relation to the named object. Many have appealed to such an historical/causal communication-chain relation, yet few have provided a rigorous analysis of it. Clearly, it depends upon a detailed semantic analysis of anaphora. Berger’s book can be seen as an attempt to fill this lacuna.

The book contains three main parts. The first advances a refined theory of reference transmission and reference change. Central to this project is Berger’s account of the two ways that rigid designators secure their reference. One is by an agent introducing a term with the intention that it will designate the particular object that she is focusing upon. The other is by an agent introducing a term and a description with the intention that the term will designate whatever uniquely satisfies the description. By using these two basic notions, Berger bolsters the NTR by explaining how reference is preserved through communication chains and, further, how a terms’ reference can change (as in Evans’ example of “Madagascar”). Berger also uses his analysis to solve what he claims to be a new puzzle about identity statements.

The second part is about propositional attitude attributions. In it, Berger advocates basic principles of attitude attribution. He devotes a chapter to the current and especially interesting issue about belief attributions with empty names. And devotes another to the problem of intentional identities, giving an analysis of how attitude attributions can express an agent’s particular epistemic perspective on the world.

The last part of the book contains an analysis of anaphorically used pronouns. Berger argues that such pronouns are rigid designators, and advances a formal semantics for sentences containing anaphoric expressions. He delves deeply into the linguistics literature on anaphorically used pronouns, especially the Discourse Representation Theory (of Heim and Kamp). This part is considerably less philosophically oriented than the rest of the book (and for this reason will be largely ignored below), though will be of great interest to many who are working at the intersection of philosophy and linguistics.

Much of the terrain here is familiar: the problems are well-known and the basic distinction between the two types of rigid designation with which Berger aims to solve the problems has roots in Kripke. Furthermore, Berger is not exactly staking out a new position. The importance and strength of the book is in the superb detail with which Berger develops his theory of anaphora, and his attempts to prove its power by analyzing instances of reference change.

One of the most significant parts of Berger’s account is his careful analysis of the conditions for a successful reference-fixing of a term, either by focusing (F-style) or by description (S-style). One key claim is that in F-style reference-fixing, the reference-fixer may ascribe certain properties to the object that is focused on, but it is (generally, says Berger) the focusing itself that picks out the object as the referent, not any descriptions (that capture the properties ascribed by the reference-fixer). On the face of it, this seems quite plausible. Although the ancients assumed that “Hesperus” designated a star and not a planet, this did not invalidate their reference-fixing, for it was secured not by any assumptions in their celestial theorizing, but rather because they focused on that object shining in the evening sky. It is this fact that plays one of the key roles in differentiating F-style and S-style reference-fixing.

Berger articulates a complex apparatus associated with each instance in which a term has its reference fixed. For each act of introducing a term, there are, according to Berger, anaphoric background statements (A-B statement), anaphoric background conditions (A-B conditions), and presuppositions that all play a role in determining an introduced term’s reference and in accounting for reference change and transmission. An example of an A-B statement for an F-type introduction of the name “Hesperus” is “There is (something taken to be) a very bright star out tonight. Let us call it ’Hesperus’“. A-B conditions are conditions that a name must satisfy at the initial introduction into the language in order for it to designate. In our example, one such condition is that the reference-fixer must in fact focus on the object (the very heavenly body) she intends to designate with the name “Hesperus”. Presuppositions are assumptions that a reference-fixer of an F-type term makes about the object she intends to name. These involve classifying the intended object by means of some sortal or other, as in parents’ assumption that the baby they are now focusing on is their baby.

Berger lays down these notions, but typically does so primarily by offering up examples. This leaves a number of unanswered questions about—and possibly also difficulties with—his analysis. What is the difference between an agent ascribing a property to an object and an agent presupposing something about the object she is focusing on? And what is the semantic difference, if any? Berger claims that, generally, ascriptions themselves neither secure the reference nor invalidate the reference-fixing by focusing (in an F-type case), as in the case of “Hesperus”. Yet he also claims that an act of naming by means of a focusing may be annulled if a presupposition is violated, as in a case in which a parent assumes that the child before her is her own baby, yet unbeknownst to her, the doctor initially brought in the wrong baby. According to Berger, if the error is soon discovered, the initial naming may be annulled. It seems he thinks this annulment ought to be attributed to the presupposition made by the reference-fixer. Yet since Berger does not offer an analysis of what distinguishes presuppositions from assumptions made and then ascribed to an object, we still stand in need of an account of what it is that has the “power” to annul or redirect reference. Consider this case: suppose I’m a billionaire and I am interested in buying a small island because I believe it is the most oil-rich island on the market. When I buy my island, I visit it (focus on it) and name it, and also I think of it as my oil-rich island. If I’ve been duped, have I not named my island? It seems I have. (And it is implausible to suppose that the naming may be annulled because of my mistake.) But it also seems that at a psychological level, my thinking of my island as oil-rich is entirely analogous to a parent thinking that this baby is her baby. Perhaps the divide cannot be made out psychologically. Maybe what is doing the work is something social. (Berger might well by sympathetic with this social type of diagnosis.) In any event, what is needed is some way to differentiate presuppositions and ascriptions and their associated semantic powers.

A related question can be illustrated by considering a counterfactual scenario concerning the reference-fixing of “Neptune”, which in fact originally had its reference-fixed descriptively (S-type) as “the planet causing such-and-such discrepancies in the orbits of the other planets” and came to assume the status of an F-type term once astronomers telescopically identified the planet that satisfies that description. In the counterfactual scenario, we now learn that the planet telescopically identified (focused on) by astronomers is not in fact the planet that satisfies the initial reference-fixing description. Some other planet satisfies that description. Berger claims that in this scenario, we’d maintain that the planet focused on is the referent of “Neptune” despite the fact that we knew it failed to satisfy the description used for the initial introduction of the term in S-type rigid designation. We would not claim that the planet that does satisfy the description is Neptune. He seems to think that the focusing being a focusing ensures that we’d say this. I’m willing to grant Berger’s intuition that this is what we’d say about this case, as described. But I wonder whether he has advanced the correct diagnosis as to why we’d say this. What if it was only a single day between the time when scientists focused on the planet and their recognition that it was not the cause of the discrepancies in the orbits of the other planets? Then I’d be inclined to think that we would say that the planet focused on is not Neptune, that there has been a mistake, and another planet is Neptune. Yet all that has changed between the two scenarios is the time when we make our discovery. Here, the case seems just like the case of the baby. What then accounts for the different intuitions stemming from the time interval? Is the A-B condition for the S-type naming now a presupposition? Perhaps. And perhaps an initial presupposition loses its power to annul once enough time goes by and the community takes the object as satisfying the relevant presupposition. Is the presupposition then just converted into an ordinary property that people think the object has, losing its capacity to annul or redirect reference? If so, why is this?

Berger introduces what he calls a new puzzle concerning identity statements. Since the identity relation is symmetrical, how can proponents of the NRT maintain that being H2O is an essential property of water but being water is not an essential property of H2O? He claims that this puzzle gains backing from the linguistic intuition that “Cicero” is a name for Tully and “Tully” is a name for Cicero, yet it seems that while “water” is a name for H2O, the name “H2O” is not a name for water. But since water = H2O, it seems that it must be.

I have difficulties calling this a novel puzzle concerning identity statements, and I have doubts about the linguistic intuitions (I am inclined to think that “H2O” is a name for water.), but it is clear what Berger is trying to get at and the point is an important one. He holds that it seems that there is some variety of semantic content in terms like “H2O” that is not had in ordinary names like “Cicero”. Yet he thinks that we will share his intuition that they are names all the same, not abbreviations for definite descriptions. Berger’s very plausible solution is that terms like “H2O” and “Au79” are S-type names, names whose reference was fixed with a definite description, yet functions like an ordinary name. He calls them structural descriptive names. I am inclined to agree with Berger that such terms are not abbreviations for their introducing descriptions, but I think this is exceptionally controversial, and one would like to see an argument as to why they are not. (By way of support, Berger cites Kripke’s claim that numerals are not rigid definite descriptions, but this does not help since the point about numerals is every bit as controversial.)

I do not think that these present any insurmountable problems for Berger. I press them here because I think even more work needs to be done in providing an analysis of the roots of reference for the NRT. What Berger has done already is substantial and impressive. This book is a high-level, penetrating development of the epistemic background for and the semantics of anaphora – definitely required reading for those interested in the theory of reference.