Terrorism: A Philosophical Investigation

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Igor Primoratz, Terrorism: A Philosophical Investigation, Polity, 2013, 195pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745651446.


Reviewed by Lawrence M. Hinman, University of San Diego


Igor Primoratz has given us a thoughtful, nuanced philosophical discussion of the concept of terrorism and a provocative analysis of two specific cases of terrorism: the Allied carpet bombing of German cities and the Israeli-Palestinian conflict. His book provides an insightful analysis of why we experience terrorism as morally repugnant (the intentional targeting of the innocent in order to change the minds of those in power), thoroughly undermines relativist claims that one person's terrorism is another person's patriotism, and convincingly demonstrates the ways in which nation states can engage in terrorism. Indeed, modern terrorism goes back to Robespierre and the Reign of Terrorism, a watershed moment in modern history that forged a tight link between terrorism and the inculcation of virtue.

Primoratz is rightly concerned about facile definitions of terrorism that serve particular political or otherwise partisan purposes, and he devotes his opening chapters to a careful conceptual analysis of terrorism. Terrorism, he concludes is "the deliberate use of violence, or the threat of its use, against innocent people, in order to intimidate some other people and coerce them into doing what they otherwise would not do." (170-71). Thus, the four principal components: (1) the use of violence, (2) directed toward innocent people, (3) in order to coerce others (the primary target) to change policies or behavior (4) through the use of intimidation.

Primoratz draws a crucial distinction between the secondary, proximate targets of terrorist violence and the primary, ultimate targets, and he uses this distinction skillfully to illuminate the reason that we find terrorism so morally repugnant. The terrorist kills innocent civilians (the immediate target) to pressure a government to change its policies (the ultimate target). These are innocent victims that the terrorist knows are innocent, given any standard understanding of innocence and responsibility. Thus, this is the core moral transgression that defines terrorism. Given this definition, terrorism is not the exclusive preserve of non-state actors, nor is it the case that only one party in a conflict can carry out terrorist actions. Essentially it is violence against innocent people (who are known to be innocent) for the purpose of coercing someone else to perform a particular action.

Primoratz's book has many virtues. One of its principal virtues is that it is sensitive to the ways in which terrorism is not something confined to non-state actors; states can engage in terrorism as well. Primoratz assiduously avoids leaving himself in the relativist's bind that one person's terrorist is another person's patriot. Instead he focuses on the key characteristic of attacking innocent people in order to change the mind of someone else. This allows him to see the continuity between Allied carpet-bombing of Dresden and the sarin gas attacks in the Tokyo subways. Yet he reserves the term "terrorist state" for those states that employ terrorist tactics (often through a secret police) in a sustained and lasting way against their own populations. Examples include the Soviet Union during Stalin's reign and Nazi Germany. For Primoratz, such states seem inevitably to be totalitarian in Arendt's sense of that term.

Furthermore, in Primoratz's eyes, state terrorism -- everything else being equal -- is worse than non-state terrorism. Primoratz offers several reasons for this. Typically, the scale of such terrorism is far greater than any terrorism a non-state actor could inflict. Second, such terrorism usually involves a level of deceit and hypocrisy not usually seen in non-state actors. Third, state terrorism often involves the violation of international treaties and obligations. Finally, states cannot justify the use of terrorism by saying that no other means were available, whereas this is more likely to be true in regard to non-state actors. To this list I would add a fifth point: states owe their own citizens a special obligation, a duty to protect, that is violated when terrorism is directed at its own citizenry.

Particularly relevant and interesting in this context is Primoratz's discussion of Jacobin France. Terrorism began as a state-sponsored enterprise, and only in the late nineteenth century did we see the emergence of non-state terrorist actors, a development that expanded rapidly in the twentieth century and continues into our own century. In the French experience, terrorism was seen as the instrument of virtue; according to Robespierre, only through terror could virtue be inculcated in the citizenry as a whole.

The second virtue of Primoratz's work is that he grounds his analysis in real-life examples, ones that are drawn in sufficient detail so we can appreciate the applicability of his definition. Although the two chapters that precede the conclusion are devoted to specific case studies, he does not confine his use of examples to those chapters. They are found throughout his work and provide a richness to his text and illuminate the power of his framework.

Third, Primoratz has an impressive (but not surprising) command of the relevant literature. In saying this, I do not mean that he goes through one position after another seriatim, discussing the strengths and weaknesses of each. Rather, his discussion of other positions is more organic than that. As I was reading the book for the first time, I often found myself thinking "but what about so-and-so?" only to have that person discussed in the next paragraph or the following few pages. Occasionally, he brings in authors I would not have thought to include (such as W. B. Gallie on essentially contested concepts), but even then I realized he has seen a connection that I had not initially made. It's a bit like an unexpected but delightful encounter with an old friend whom you had not seen in a long time.

Fourth, Primoratz goes to great lengths to delineate the conceptual contours of the moral repugnance we experience when confronting terrorism. It stems, he argued, from our belief in the value of innocent life and the intentional taking of such life, the way in which the innocent are used (killed and maimed) to further the terrorists' political goals. He places the foreseeable but unintended killing and maiming of innocent civilians as a side effect only a small notch below terrorism proper, and singles out those attacks by terrorists "who do the killing and maiming [and] refuse to take any chance of being harmed themselves in the process" (46). One cannot help thinking of the concerted American drone campaign in the Middle East and some African countries -- and I suspect that Primoratz wants us to draw this connection -- but it is worth noting that this has long been a feature of war in certain respects. Typically, the sniper -- although not as insolated as a drone pilot -- kills from concealment, and the development of long-range artillery and then missiles were attempts to move in this direction as well. This raises an interesting and important question: are there some methods of warfare that are inherently terroristic? It would seem that drone warfare, and nuclear/chemical/biological warfare, and high altitude bombing would be reasonable candidates for this questionable distinction.

Fifth and finally, Primoratz gives us two extended applications of his theory. The first of these, the Allied bombing of German citizens in Hamburg and Dresden, is the less controversial of the two. The other, which deals with the Palestinian-Israeli conflict, will undoubtedly be more controversial in the eyes of many readers. Primoratz sees the Palestinians, the Zionists, and the state of Israel as engaging in terrorism and as being in the wrong. Many would dispute Primoratz's claim that Israel has "never faced an imminent threat of a moral disaster" (174), but even such disputes are worthwhile, for they focus attention on the genuinely important moral issues.

Primoratz has done an admirable job of delineating the conceptual and moral contours of terrorism in the twentieth century, yet the terrain depicted in this fine work is rapidly changing, changing in ways that will profoundly alter our perception of terrorism and the instruments of its harm. The twentieth century paradigm is still one of brute force, of maiming and torturing and killing, but the twenty-first century has ushered in a new dimension of warfare by remote control. At first this transformation will only occur within the armed forces of major nations, but it is already well underway. Some of my students who want to become naval aviators are being told by their commanders that this will likely be the last generation of human pilots, and already drone warplanes have successfully landed on carrier decks. DARPA's grand challenge for robotic cars insures that the military will have sophisticated driverless convoy trucks that can speed through the night without lights. Its latest challenge, the first round of which was in December 2013, is aimed at robotic soldiers. Star Wars seems less a fiction that it did even ten years ago. Many, presumably including Primoratz, find this asymmetry morally disturbing, and I hope in his future work Primoratz directs his attention to this issue.

In the last decade, we have also seen a steady shift away from the traditional terrain of conflict -- the battlefield in wars, often the city in terrorist attacks -- toward conflict in or through the virtual world. No one is killed, at least directly, but many live under the constant threat of Bentham's Panopticon. The Snowden papers reveal a massive, multinational surveillance state capable of tracking the movements and even thoughts of everyday citizens. Yet this does not stop with mere surveillance, although -- if Foucault is right -- the adjective "mere" has no place here. From what little we can see, it appears that many nations -- including the United States -- are engaged in cyber attacks against other countries, and there is little doubt that these will escalate. It is not clear if these have escalated to terrorism yet, since often they do not target innocent victims in order to coerce a policy change, but such developments have a certain inevitability about them. The control of financial transactions has been a major instrument of American anti-terrorism and anti-drug policy, and it is easy to see the ways in which an individual can suddenly be cut off from access to money (suspending your ATM and charge cards), travel (with airport screening), and communication (with monitoring of voice as well as text traffic). The increasing emphasis on secrecy -- which seems simply to produce more leaks -- is matched by the unprecedented criminal prosecution of leaks by the Obama administration and its aggressive pursuit of Chelsea Manning, Julian Assange, and Edward Snowden. To be sure, this is not prosecution of the completely innocent, but one cannot help but wonder whether it is not also an attempt to "send a message" to all citizens that they, too, are in jeopardy. We are not there yet, thankfully, but there is little indication that we are going to change course and veer away from this destination. The telos, as it were, is a state that has total information awareness but which carefully guards its own internal works from outside scrutiny. Its method of choice will not be the guillotine but cyber isolation, rendering potentially threatening individuals and groups powerless, impotent to pursue their agenda. This may become the face of twenty-first century terrorism.