Terrorism and the Ethics of War

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Stephen Nathanson, Terrorism and the Ethics of War, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 317pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521137164.

Reviewed by Tamar Meisels, Tel-Aviv University


Speaking at the United Nations in 1974, Yasser Arafat stated that, "The difference between the revolutionary and the terrorist lies in the reason for which each fights. For whoever stands by a just cause and fights for freedom and liberation of his land … cannot possibly be called terrorist."[1] If this is so, then one man's terrorist is another man's freedom fighter, as the familiar hackneyed slogan asserts. If not, then how should terrorism be defined? And what, if anything, is distinctly wrong about it? Can terrorism ever be justified? Are the common condemnations of terrorism credible? If not, why not?

Stephen Nathanson takes on these complicated questions, as well as broader just war issues they connect with, in his new four-part book, Terrorism and the Ethics of War.


Setting out with definitions, Nathanson rejects "agent-focused" accounts that associate terrorism solely with group violence and rule out the possibility of terrorism performed by states. He also rejects definitions that include automatic condemnation of terrorism. Like many theorists, Nathanson adopts a "tactical" definition, focusing on the specific tactic of terrorism as an action category, without reference to the nature of the perpetrators or the justness of their goal and without rendering terrorism morally unjustifiable by definition. Terrorism's distinctly objectionable feature is described familiarly as the purposeful killing and injuring of innocent people, with the latter defined as those who lack military status as well as any significant degree of personal responsibility for the terrorists' grievance. Consequently, the term "terrorism" excludes the killing of military personnel as well as political assassination, which may be morally justifiable when employed in the service of a just cause. Nathanson defends his definition as politically neutral, leaving open the conceptual possibility of justifying particular terrorist acts as well as allowing for the possibility of state terrorism. Though justification is not ruled out by definition, Nathanson goes on to condemn terrorism categorically. All this essentially mirrors Michael Walzer's chapters on guerrilla war and terrorism in his classic Just and Unjust Wars,[2] as well as its echoes in many other theoretical accounts.

Lack of originality is, however, no vice in this instance. Instead, the strength of the discussion in this first part of the book lies in its clarity. It ties together a wide range of arguments widely debated since 9/11 in an exceptionally tidy and readable form. A detailed defense of this frequent account of terrorism makes the first five chapters of the book well worth reading.


The second part of the book asks why political condemnation of terrorism often lacks credibility. Condemnation of terrorism, Nathanson answers, is credible only when it is combined with a sincere and unbiased consistent opposition to targeting the innocent, no matter the identity of the killers or the victims and no matter the cause. Much political anti-terrorist rhetoric is not like this.

Worse still, Nathanson argues, not all academic condemnations of terrorism are credible in this sense either. Many permit the violation of noncombatant immunity under certain circumstances and therefore lack credibility when they condemn the terrorism of others. Most contentiously, Nathanson argues that Michael Walzer's defense of the British bombing of German cities in the early years of World War II undermines his absolute condemnation of terrorism. Walzer's defense of terror bombing under circumstances of "supreme emergency" shows, in Nathanson's view, that he does not sincerely hold to an absolute prohibition on attacking civilians, as he claims to. His categorical condemnation of terrorism is tarred by his own defense of these bombings. Categorical condemnation of terrorism is inconsistent with permitting attacks on civilians in "supreme emergency" circumstances.


Nathanson's lengthy critique of Walzer is one of the most central and powerful sections in the book. It criticizes Walzer's views on the rights of civilians in wartime as only "limited noncombatant immunity," which can be overridden when the stakes are high enough. If the prohibition on attacking civilians was overridden in the case of the German cities, Nathanson argues, then Walzer's adherence to this prohibition is less than absolute, and his categorical condemnation of terrorism is less than credible.

Nathanson develops this interesting critique of Walzer in Part III of his book, but it is arguable whether he succeeds in discrediting Walzer's commitment to noncombatant immunity. Nathanson's argument is most persuasive on the understanding that Walzer entirely sets aside the principle of noncombatant immunity in the case of the British pre-1942 terror bombings, regarding them as straightforwardly permissible. Walzer leaves himself open to this interpretation when he says, for example, that in the darkest emergency moments the rules "perhaps have to be overridden," though he adds that they "have to be overridden precisely because they have not been suspended."[3] Nathanson's argument is somewhat less convincing if one reads Walzer as hesitantly suggesting that the 1940-41 British bombings of Germany may have been a necessary wrongdoing in this entirely exceptional case, given the uniquely diabolical enemy on the European front.[4] Thus, Walzer argues that the leaders who ordered attacks on noncombatants did not emerge from the war blameless, with clean hands and a clear conscience, as they would have had it been entirely permissible to act as they did.

This "dirty hands" argument is also presented by Nathanson as inconsistent with an absolute ban on attacking civilians. Nathanson takes issue with Walzer's well-known paradox whereby political leaders faced with extreme emergencies may be right in making decisions -- such as attacking noncombatants -- that are at the same time morally wrong for them to undertake. Paradoxically, Walzer argues, there is a sense in which political leaders in extreme emergencies ought to do what they ought not to do, as in ordering torture in a "ticking bomb" scenario, if this is the last resort necessary for saving countless civilians, or bombarding civilians in order to prevent a truly genocidal threat.[5] Walzer focuses on the residual guilt of the decision maker in such cases. If the act were straightforwardly permissible, for instance as the lesser of two evils, then there would be no "dirty hands" to speak of.

Nathanson's point is that in practice Walzer's prescription for political leaders falls short of an absolute prohibition on attacking civilians. Consequently, he argues, Walzer's categorical condemnation of terrorism is inconsistent: "Walzer does not see noncombatant immunity as an absolute, exceptionless constraint on how war may be fought. Instead, he believes that under 'supreme emergency' conditions, noncombatant immunity gives way, and civilians become permissible targets" (p. 146).

Walzer's dirty hands argument has been the object of much critical attention and Nathanson certainly adds a new and distinctive perspective to this debate. Whatever the merits of the paradox, however, it is noteworthy that for Walzer "dirty hands" is a distinctly absolutist's predicament rather than a denunciation or weakening of absolute moral commitments. If Walzer's condemnation of terrorism were not categorical, his political leader who violates noncombatant immunity would not suffer from "dirty hands" at all. Were it not for Walzer's absolute commitment to noncombatant immunity, the rule about civilians would simply be set aside in cases of supreme emergency, and the politician ordering the bombings would emerge entirely innocent and unblemished. It is precisely because Walzer adheres to a categorical ban on terrorism that the dirty hands paradox arises to begin with.

Apart from his criticism of Walzer, Nathanson argues more generally that no existing ethics of war can consistently condemn terrorism. Realists certainly cannot denounce terrorism as they hold that "all's fair in love and war," or at least all that is necessary or valuable to attaining their military goal. Common-sense morality is more sympathetic to noncombatant immunity, but it contains a strong patriotic strand that often places greater value on the lives of fellow citizens, including soldiers, than on the lives of enemy civilians. Traditional just war theory is also insufficient in this regard, Nathanson argues, because it allows for large scale "collateral" killing of civilians and therefore holds no moral high ground from which to sincerely condemn the killing of the innocent. Right-based moralities of war supply the language for absolute prohibitions, but they are hard-pressed to uphold moral absolutes in catastrophic scenarios where various individual rights conflict seriously with each other.

Toward the end of the third part of his book, Nathanson introduces his own principle of "strong noncombatant immunity", which he develops on the basis of rule-utilitarian reasoning. Utilitarianism is commonly taken as incapable of defending moral absolutes, as its prescriptions are ultimately subject to the outcome of a cost-benefit calculation. It is easy to see how utilitarian calculations can permit attacks on noncombatants under circumstances in which violating civilian immunity would yield better results in terms of minimizing overall human suffering. Nathanson argues to the contrary that rule-utilitarianism can actually yield absolute rules, specifically a rule about noncombatant immunity. Stated briefly, his central thesis is that adopting an absolute prohibition on attacking civilians, with no exception for "supreme emergency", is overall the most beneficial rule for minimizing the human costs of war.

When defending his own view, Nathanson introduces the distinction between justifications and excuses for dealing with the "extreme emergency" scenario. He admits that in situations of dire peril people might understandably refrain from adhering to his absolute rule about civilian immunity, despite its overall utility. In cases of extreme danger, he suggests, we might consider offenders as partially excused for attacking civilians, rather than fully justified. This, he points out rightly, is quite different from giving up the view that such attacks are absolutely wrong.


The final issue taken up in this book is the problem of collateral damage. In traditional just war theory as well as international law, the prohibition on harming civilians in wartime is widely regarded as applying less stringently to unintended effects. Arguing that "intentions don't always matter", Nathanson suggests that the just war tradition fails to provide sufficient protection for civilians. Having criticized just war theorists' commitment to civilian immunity on this basis, as well as the credibility of their condemnation of terrorism, Nathanson wishes to defend his own view from a similar charge. "Since both terrorist attacks and collateral damage attacks result in dead and injured civilians, people who condemn one but not the other need to have a good account of their differential responses to these acts" (p. 286). In the last section of the book, Nathanson works out his own views on the collateral killing of civilians in relation to other ethics of war.

After a lengthy discussion, Nathanson's conclusions on collateral killing are not unusual and, in fact, are quite similar to Walzer's account back in Just and Unjust Wars and ever since. War inevitably harms civilians. Any non-pacifist view must allow for some degree of collateral killing. If wars are to be fought at all, some incidental harm to civilians must be permissible. Such collateral harm to civilians is justified when it is sincerely unintentional, is incurred in the course of an attack which aims to discriminate between combatants and noncombatants, and where considerable precautions are taken to that effect.

Questioning what counts as serious precautionary efforts to avoid harming civilians, Nathanson refers us to Israel's 2009 incursion into Gaza, which, Nathanson mentions in passing, "resulted in 1,300 civilian deaths" (p. 267). While Israeli and Palestinian figures differ, the most widely accepted estimate of the total death toll for Gaza ranges from 1,300 to 1,400.[6] Walzer and Avishai Margalit's "Israel: Civilians and Combatants", discussed by Nathanson, is indeed invaluable to thinking about these issues.[7]

It is noteworthy, however, that Nathanson's figures on Gaza, as stated, are somewhat misleading. They are accurate to the extent that none of the Palestinian casualties were uniformed soldiers. As presented in the context of his discussion on collateral damage, however, Nathanson's figures suggest, perhaps inadvertently, that all were protected civilians. Another Cambridge University Press volume on terrorism also published in 2010, Michael Gross's excellent Moral Dilemmas of Modern War, helpfully explains the dispute over numbers:

The Palestinians count over 900 civilians among the dead, while Israeli figures number only 300 to 400. Obviously, this makes a huge difference when assessing proportionality. The problem is not one of identification; authorities knew the names of most of the dead. Rather, the dispute turns on affiliation. Who, exactly, counts as a civilian or combatant?[8]

If, contra everyone involved, all 1,300 casualties in Gaza were protected civilians, as Nathanson implies, this would mean that Hamas suffered virtually no combatant casualties and that the Israeli Defence Forces rarely, if ever, struck a legitimate target. Though this may seem like a minute criticism of Nathanson's account, one would expect a 50-page discussion of collateral damage and proportionality to include accurate detailed figures, or at least to back up controversial ones with some sort of data.

Be that as it may, Nathanson's emphasis is on the precautionary measures for safeguarding civilians in wartime, which he regards as an independent principle of his ethics of war rather than an interpretation of the proportionality requirement or a mere addition to other restrictions. Walzer, in Nathanson's view, merely "sees the precautionary requirement as a gloss on the principle of double effect." (p. 276) Nevertheless, the specifics of Nathanson's requirements are again not very different from Walzer's. It is not enough for soldiers not to intend to kill civilians; they must take serious precautions to avoid collateral harm. In Walzer's words: they "must intend not to kill civilians, and that active intention can be made manifest only through the risks the soldiers themselves accept in order to reduce the risks to civilians."[9] The precautions taken must be genuine and considerable, rather than empty rituals with questionable efficacy. Armies must carefully choose targets and methods that aim to discriminate between combatants and civilians. Soldiers may never be negligent or reckless with civilian lives and must protect civilians even by assuming greater personal risk. Beyond this, Nathanson affirms the traditional proportionality requirement stated in the Geneva Protocols. Even once these precautionary conditions have been met, Nathanson explains, whatever harm to civilians remains must still be proportionate in relation to the anticipated military advantage of the attack.[10]

When all these conditions are adhered to, Nathanson asserts, it cannot be said that the remaining collateral harm is similar to terrorism.

Placing collateral damage under these restrictions clearly separates it from the intentional terrorist acts which many of us condemn. Terrorists, needless to say, do not take precautions in order to spare civilian lives. Only an ethics of war that places permissible harm to civilians under these severe restrictions, Nathanson concludes, is a sound basis for sincere condemnation of terrorism.

Nathanson certainly succeeds in showing that adhering to his restrictions on collateral damage distinguishes legitimate warfare from terrorism and that condemnation of the latter is credible when it comes from his ethics of war. Ultimately, his readers will have to judge whether Nathanson's ethics of war is essentially different from Walzer's on these scores, or significantly distinguishable from the ethical views shared by many of us who believe our own condemnation of terrorism to be no less credible than Nathanson's.

[1] Speech of Yasser Arafat before the UN General Assembly, November 13, 1974. Quoted by Nathanson (p. 19).

[2] Michael Walzer, Just and Unjust Wars: A Moral Argument with Historical Illustration (Basic Books, 1977), Chaps 11, 12.

[3] Michael Walzer, "Emergency Ethics", in Michael Walzer, Arguing About War (Yale University Press, 2004), p. 34.

[4] See Walzer, Just and Unjust War, Chap. 7 on pp. 109-16, Chap 16 on pp. 255-68.

[5] Michael Walzer, "Political Action: The Problem of Dirty Hands", Philosophy and Public Affairs, Vol. 2(2) (1973), pp. 160-80.

[7] Michael Walzer and Avishai Margalit: "Israel: Civilians and Combatants", The New York Review of Books, Vol. 56 (8), May 14, 2009.

[8] Michael L. Gross, Moral Dilemmas of Modern War (Cambridge University Press, 2010), pp. 255-6.

[9] Walzer and Margalit: "Israel: Civilians & Combatants".

[10] Protocol Additional to the Geneva Conventions of 12 August 1949, and relating to the Protection of Victims of International Armed Conflicts (Protocol 1) 1977. Article 57 (2) (a) (iii).