Terrorism and the Right to Resist: A Theory of Just Revolutionary War

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Christopher J. Finlay, Terrorism and the Right to Resist: A Theory of Just Revolutionary War, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 339pp., $103.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107040939.

Reviewed by Margaret Moore, Queen's University


This is an in-depth, systematic study of an important and timely dimension of the phenomenon of violent resistance or rebellion. After a brief period in the post-Cold War era, in which many were lulled into believing we had entered a stage of democratic transition and the abandonment of guerilla war and terrorist tactics (by the IRA, the ANC and the PLO), we are now back to considering the ethics of armed force as it is used in the struggle to secure human rights against domestic tyranny or foreign injustice. Since the Arab Spring, and violent events in the Ukraine and the Russian occupation there, we need urgently to consider the ethics of armed 'resistance', when it is justifiable, when it is not, and what is permitted in its name. Christopher J. Finlay's book admirably fills this lacuna, and represents a highly original discussion of many complex aspects of the right to resist.

Finlay begins by noting that the relationship between legitimate armed resistance, rebellion, revolution and terrorism is very complex, and that most discussion of 'terrorism' has proceeded without a prior theory of what constitutes 'legitimate armed resistance'. Finlay's strategy is not to consider terrorism as a separate phenomenon, but to gain insights from a general theory of the right to resist oppression.

This argument unfolds in logical steps. Finlay first locates the right to resist oppression within a theory of human rights: if we have human rights, we must have a right to resist those who wish to suppress our human rights. In chapter 2 he offers an all-things-considered account of the justification for the right to resist, viz., when it is the most proportionate strategy for securing human rights (that is, where it offers a sufficiently favorable balance between the expected gains in human rights compliance, and the equivalent harms and risks likely to arise from resistance).

A right to resist doesn't get us a right to do so through armed force, especially if this taking of lives is done for the purposes of securing civil and political liberties, which may violate proportionality. In chapter 3, 'Rights worth killing for', Finlay distinguishes between Life and Limb Rights and Political Rights. The first involve direct physical harm to the body such as rape, the loss of life, the loss of a limb or vision, and wrongful incarceration or enslavement, for which it's unproblematic that it's proportionate to kill in self-defense against a direct and immediate threat. These rights are not the focus of his book, though they are important to his justification of necessity and proportionality. He is primarily interested in Political Rights, which include all remaining core human rights along with reasonable goals such as the pursuit of social justice and individual and collective autonomy. His book is a long exploration of the tension between two fundamental rights commitments:

on the one hand, we want to be able to make sense of the idea that Political Rights -- including values like free speech, democratic accountability, freedom of conscience and assembly, self-determination, etc. -- can sometimes be defended or actively pursued, and by force of arms if necessary. On the other hand, we want to secure the more fundamental Life and Limb Rights -- particularly the moral claim against being killed when one hasn't contributed a threat of harm commensurable with killing -- and to avoid jeopardizing or trivializing it by invoking a principle of 'killing for liberty' that is overly permissive. (p. 58)

Finlay then offers an account of 'wide proportionality' that opens up the possibility of resisting in defense of purely political rights.

How, though, can self-determination and social justice be the goals of rightful resistance, especially when resistance is likely to threaten Life and Limb Rights? Finlay considers a number of responses to this question before offering his own, which focuses on the idea that political regimes typically prevent the exercise of liberties through conditional threats: they threaten violence if people exercise free speech, organize politically, or criticize the regime. Some (Richard Norman, David Rodin) think lethal violence is unjustified in cases of conditional threats. But Finlay analyses the situation diachronically, pointing out those who resist an oppressive government that seeks to force them into retreat by means of conditional threats are not prohibited a priori from continuing to resist, and that they become justified when the government escalates the situation by using force and thereby threatening Life and Limb Rights.

What kind of right is 'the right to resist' though? Is it a liberty right? -- that we are at liberty to resist oppression, which is the view held by Locke and now by James Nickel? This gives the subjects of oppression a free choice. Or is it a duty, as has been suggested by Michael Walzer, Thomas Jefferson and Martin Luther King Jr.? Does it entail third party obligations of assistance? These issues, as well as Finlay's application of wide proportionality, are made concrete in discussions of different strategies that may arise in different contexts.  There is Purely Defensive Violence (repelling an attacker using such force as is necessary for effective defense, providing it is not disproportionate).  There is Strategic Non-violence, which involves individuals being asked not to defend themselves, even if they have a right to do so, and instead, adopt nonviolence as a strategy, as with the movements led by Gandhi and King.  There is Organized Offensive Violence, which has three variants: standard, conventional jus in bello war; partisan war, which diverges from the first by permitting targeted assassinations on those who are not part of the military but who are nevertheless morally responsible for threats to Life and Limb Rights; and terrorist war, which involves the targeting of civilians. Each of these is discussed in separate chapters.

The point of these discussions of resistance, Finlay says, is "to offer an action-guiding framework for participants in conflict", and a "normative frame of reference" from which third parties can analyze them (p. 12). The key criteria by which the strategy's appropriateness is determined turn out to be in bello ones of proportionality and necessity. Finlay argues that we need to think about the overall (wide) proportionality of means and ends, and he presents a complicated and nuanced analysis of the balance of costs and benefits expected from engaging in armed resistance. This is because the scale and distribution of harms will vary depending on who fights, who may be targeted, who is immune, and so on. Not surprisingly, some of the more controversial strategies are very difficult to justify because they are likely to fall foul of necessity and proportionality.

Finlay is careful (p. 109) to stress that his discussion, and use of the term 'code' to encompass strategies of resistance or 'frames of war' which involve "action guidance, interpretation, and judgment" (p. 105) is not meant to imply relativism. He thinks that the basic principles of morality are universally valid, which is clear throughout his book. The aim of resistance is to overcome oppressive social and political institutions; the aim of armed forces is to defend innocent persons from attack while resisting; and the purpose of disciplining the armed force used by resistance fighters according to any set of rules is to try to realize these two aims as fully as possible while respecting limits set by basic moral principles themselves. I will come back to this last point at the end. The point here is that the choice of tactical repertoire isn't just a strategic choice but a moral one, because it needs a systematic defense in actual cases of armed conflict. Finlay is at his best in his discussions of such things as the tradeoffs between enemy casualties, likely innocent casualties, and so on. There is a very nice discussion of how we should 'count' innocent non-combatant non-beneficiaries, etc., and how we should think of resistance if the very people likely to die are also the ones likely to suffer oppression.

There are two key problems that Finlay focuses on in his discussions of resistance: first the authority of non-state groups to declare war and to treat enemy soldiers as 'combatants', and hence as legitimate targets; and the second, the justification for using irregular tactics, particularly non-uniformed combatants.

Finlay argues that we ought not assume that a 'legitimate authority' must be a state. What we need is a criterion to decide when an organization has the legitimate authority to engage in armed conflict. Finlay tries to steer a course between two rocks -- he doesn't want to concede legitimate authority indiscriminately to all violent groups that claim to act on political motives, nor does he want to reject all such groups, who, in the nature of the case, cannot demonstrate a democratic mandate. He argues that we need to pay attention to the often informal ways in which non-state movements can achieve legitimate authority and to develop an adequate account of these in the wider context of just war theory. Although this is difficult in the context of human rights oppression, because often victims of violence and injustice are robbed of the ability to deliberate about their political options and act on that basis, Finlay argues that it's not impossible. First, some kinds of resistance are easily justifiable as an extension of an individual right of resistance, especially when their Life and Limb Rights are violated. In the case of violence in defense of purely political aims, it is especially important that we have some credible measures of approval for the non-state group, such as mass demonstrations, general strikes, and polling, which would provide some indication of support for the group's policies.

Finlay also examines the deployment of non-uniformed combatants. It has traditionally been argued that this practice is problematic because it shifts the risk of harm to non-combatants by making it difficult to distinguish between combatants and noncombatants. But Finlay's analysis examines the balance between this and the increased likelihood of securing the population's rights against the greater risks to the population from the state's oppressive practices. He also offers an illuminating discussion in the case of partisan war under occupation, where there is no dividing line between two opposing sides, to which combatants can withdraw, regroup, and so on. Since the theatre of war unavoidably overlaps with the spaces of civilian life, the requirement that the partisan soldier wear a uniform is equivalent to an invitation to be eliminated by the enemy. Civilian camouflage is generally justified, though using civilians as human shields is not, because the latter has a different distribution of risks.

I've argued that Finlay's book is a welcome and very distinctive contribution, focusing on a category -- revolutionary warfare -- that is under-theorized. Although it is situated within the category of just war theory, it departs somewhat from most of those in the category, not only in its subject matter but, to a lesser extent, in its focus. A lot of work on just war and defensive rights, especially since Jeff McMahan's seminal contribution, depends on distinguishing between just and unjust wars, just and unjust motives, and so on, and the argument follows from there. There is some plausibility to that move, but I think it is too captive to the picture that we've inherited since World War II, with a clear aggressor state, which was also egregiously unjust to its own population and to those in occupied territory. But perhaps this is not the typical case. Perhaps it's more typical for both sides to think that they have justice on their side, although they may differ in their arguments, their motives, and sense of grievance. In many cases, they are resisting, not on behalf of justice in the abstract sense, but in defense of their national community. Finlay is aware that the rebels and revolutionaries and terrorists that are the subject of his book are often acting in pursuit of reasonable goals that an oppressive state doesn't allow them to pursue through legitimate means; and he shows that the underlying architecture of just war theory, with its concepts of just cause (human rights), proportionality, necessity, and so on, is nevertheless relevant.

At various points, I had a vague methodological worry about the level at which the analysis was pitched. In one of the book's best sections, in which Finlay draws on Hume's discussion of conventions, he argues that the standard jus in bello considerations do not represent natural moral duties, but are justified because they provide a stable position on which people who are likely to disagree about the applicability of the relevant moral concepts can agree (pp. 117-120). By showing the partial conventionality of standard jus in bello rules, Finlay is able to move on to a contextual discussion of a range of strategic frameworks that non-state actors may adopt. This is consistent with his interest in identifying (p. 109) a "set of rules" that instantiate the moral principles that he discusses. However, this raises a question that is not --as far as I can tell -- considered systematically, which is whether we need to think about the problematic effects of institutionalizing rules that are themselves justified through a carefully balanced and nuanced argument, taking into account many different moral considerations.

This problem emerges with respect to Finlay's discussion of terrorism, for example. He argues that terrorism may, in highly restrictive conditions, be all things considered justified, but should nevertheless be illegal. This is because potential terrorists are likely to be biased in their own favor, and think that their own actions or proclivities are morally justified. They may also be untrained in careful moral philosophy. The effect of saying that terrorism is sometimes justified might be to give a license to terrorism. Finlay acknowledges the dilemma and responds that we should

simply and crudely. . . recognize that terrorism might occasionally be justifiable morally but to treat it as unjustifiable in law, regardless of its motivation or moral permissibility. It may make sense to ban all terrorism and thus to provide strong disincentives to using it by making anyone responsible for terrorist acts liable to punishment. (p. 273)

I found this unsatisfactory, not only because it would mean that justified terrorists are subject to punishment even though they acted for the sake of upholding justice, but also because it raised for me the question of what the book is about, and the level of analysis at which it is pitched. Terrorism is going to be illegal anyway; no state is going to legalize terrorism in any world that we know. Finlay's key example of terrorism focused on state terrorism, such as the British bombing campaign in civilian areas in World War II, which is not the typical example that we think about when the term 'terrorism' is used, and did not immediately raise this problem of the relationship of morality to law. But if the book does in the end say that terrorism is sometimes morally justified but should be illegal in law, then, what is the point of the book? It is not engaging in the kind of institutional moral reasoning advocated by Allen Buchanan, where policies and practices are justified as a set in terms of their function in the system and criteria for determining what is morally progressive. But then what is the relationship between arguments in moral theory and the institutional mechanisms for realizing what the principles of moral theory recommend? Up to this point, I thought Finlay's analysis was meant to be action-guiding, to provide us with new ways to think about non-state actors resisting oppression, which would be encoded in some way in our policies and practices. But the discussion of terrorism made me unsure and also a little worried. There seems something wrong with a moral theory that has such unpalatable implications that the author has to eschew the implications of his own analysis.