Terrorism, Ticking Time-Bombs, and Torture: A Philosophical Analysis

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Fritz Allhoff, Terrorism, Ticking Time-Bombs, and Torture: A Philosophical Analysis, University of Chicago Press, 2012, $46.00, 266pp., ISBN 97800226014838.

Reviewed by Christopher W. Morris, University of Maryland


Fritz Allhoff's book presents a careful and thoughtful defense of the limited use of torture in certain situations. His defense is in part motivated by the challenges of contemporary, post-9/11 terrorism. It is narrowly focused on the ethics of torture, conceived of apart from policy and law. And he addresses common criticisms of torture. In all, it is a forceful defense of torture, one that should be taken seriously by all interested in the debates about the topic.


The book asks, "What are we able to do to protect ourselves . . . How far can we go to disarm terrorist threats?" Allhoff thinks that "lesser harms are always preferable to greater harms and that, while bad, torture could nonetheless be the lesser harm in exceptional cases" (ix). While I disagree with the general principle, I agree that torture might sometimes be the lesser harm and, more to the point, that torture might even be permissible in some exceptional cases. However, this concession will not suffice to lead me to accept Allhoff's conclusion that we should torture. Some of my critical reservations about the book pertain to the consequentialism of much of the argument and, more importantly, to the subtle ways in which Allhoff's utilitarianism distorts some our thinking about torture and morality.


The first third of the book is devoted to terrorism: what terrorism is, its moral status, and the war on terror. Allhoff thinks that "terrorism can and has become more lethal than it was in the past. As terrorism threatens more lives, the moral imperative to stop it becomes greater." (163) I agree, and I think the popular challenge that one is more likely to die from a bee sting or from a fall in the bathtub than from a terrorist attack fails to appreciate the threat of contemporary terrorism. The second part is devoted to torture in "ticking time-bomb" situations, cases where one may be tempted to torture someone who knows where a bomb (or other threat) lies in order to extract the information from them. This is an important part of the argument, as Allhoff's case focuses on these kinds of situations. The last part takes up a number of questions about torture in the world we live in, challenging a number of common, non-theoretical objections.


Allhoff's conclusions are quite limited and constrained. They do not support the Bush administration's torture programs and certainly don't support the behavior of different appalling torture regimes of recent times. "In a manuscript that defends the moral permissibility of torture, it bears emphasis that this defense applies only to exceptional cases and is highly circumscribed" (x). Allhoff "suspect[s] that torture would ever be justified only in cases reasonably close to ticking time-bomb cases and that the torture of innocents and preventative torture are not likely to recommend themselves." (204) He spends a lot of time on theoretical questions about the ethics of torture, focusing on ticking bomb cases. Pure ticking time-bomb cases are ones where:


everything is certain. It is certain . . . that the detainee is a terrorist . . . [and] has the information regarding the location of the bomb . . . that torture will produce the information . . . that the information will lead to the timely deactivation of the bomb. . . (91)


He asks "whether torture is permissible given features either stated or implied in the ticking time-bomb cases." (92). Allhoff argues that it is; some, perhaps many, will disagree, but I'll concede the point. However, I don't think the case is easy to make once the conditions are relaxed. Our world is not one of certainty. As recent experience shows, we often don't know whether the person in our hands is a villain with knowledge of the threat, much less whether torture will reveal that information. The use of torture to obtain information that eventually led to the whereabouts of Osama bin Laden would not be justified by Allhoff's case. Arguably, virtually none of the torture carried out under the Bush administration would be. It is noteworthy that that administration and those that followed have not revealed cases of successful torture in ticking bomb like cases.


Allhoff is a moral utilitarian, and much of his argument is consequentialist. He bends over backward to make a more general case for "exceptional" torture, considering broader considerations in favor of limited torture. He does a decent job developing the broader case, but I think it still fails. More interestingly, I think it shows the ways in which act-consequentialism in ethics (and rational choice theory) distorts our reasoning. Allhoff situates his argument in contemporary concerns about terrorism, reasonably in my opinion. He focuses on the ethics of limited torture in these special ticking bomb cases. "In all cases (and all else being equal), if we can choose a lesser harm to a greater one, we should. In ticking time-bomb cases, torture is the lesser harm. Therefore, we should torture in those cases." (116, see also 195) The general principle may seem plausible to some initially, but of course most who appreciate the role that norms, rules, and principles play in our reasoning and our lives will reject it as a general principle. Many opponents of torture have of course raised considerations of principle and policy. Now, Allhoff is not in the first instance interested in policy: "ticking-time-bomb cases are not about torture policy; they are about one-off applications of torture." (117) But it is not clear that the topic that interests us today is separable from policy. Torture carried out by agents and offices of a democratic state governed by law seems necessarily to concern policy. As David Luban says, in "the real world of interrogations, decisions are not made one-off. The real world is a world of policies, guidelines, and directives. It is a world of practices, not of ad hoc emergency measures."[1]


As I have conceded, torture is permissible in some hypothetical ticking bomb cases (though I'd want to explicate 'permissible' very carefully in ways that I cannot here). And I admit that some interesting questions can be taken up without considerations of public policy or of law (e.g., many aspects of the abortion or euthanasia debate). But almost all of our interest in torture concerns practices and policies of the military, intelligence services, and government generally. But let me say something general about norms, principles, and other deontic notions. I don't see how we can think about torture without reference to norms and principles. No one sympathetic to common sense morality, or to most moral traditions, including indirect forms of moral consequentialism, would want to evaluate torture independently of norms and principles. Allhoff acknowledges this reaction, even if he does not share it. He tries to make his case independently of his utilitarianism, but his understanding of how we should reason about these matters reveals the grip of act-consequentialism, as I shall suggest.


Allhoff's broader case for torture involves a consideration of the implications of a variety of moral theories for torture in ticking bomb cases. He argues that, for the most part, they will support his position. Readers will quibble with his characterizations of some traditions and thinkers. Hume's view, for instance, is rather simplified, and many will be surprised to be told that "virtue theory, the theory of Plato and Aristotle" suffered "a hiatus for two millennia" until recently (122). I am less impressed than some by our so-called moral theories, and I thought that common sense morality should have been given more weight.


But I want to highlight Allhoff's understanding of policy. In a revealing endnote about the contrast between cases and policies, he says that "our social policies should be to torture only in justified cases, and the associated moral rule should be to torture when doing so maximizes the moral benefits . . . Policies just represent agglomerated treatments of individual cases" (n. 19, 154/233). If you think that we should always maximize value when making a choice -- a choice in ethics or in some other domain -- and you think that a policy (or a norm or rule or principle) cannot be more than a summary of individual cases, then arguably you lack the concept of a policy, norm, rule, or principle, at least as these are understood in ordinary life and by most non-act-consequentialist theorists. Normally we understand norms, commitments, and similar deontic notions and practices as having the function of settling what to do. If I make a commitment to someone, or I have a duty to do something, then that is meant to settle what I am to do, barring, of course, circumstances that would override or extinguish the requirement.


If you think that a promise or a principle may be ignored in any situation where you have a better option, then you do not understand promises and principles (or, perhaps, you doubt we need them). Norms, commitments, and their siblings asks us to choose or act in certain ways, even in some situations where there are better alternatives open to us. They may be overridden or nullified in a variety of ways, but if they are not, they bind us. Practical reasoning with norms and principles is reasoning about action constrained by norms and principles. One of many reasons why we should want these deontic things is that our lives would be much more difficult in their absence. Indirect consequentialists often accept the point and seek to add genuine constraints to their moral framework. Often we don't know what the best thing to do is, or there is no best thing to do. And, most importantly, sometimes we do better, in terms of the best or in terms of what is mutually advantageous to us, or in terms of some other end, if we don't aim at that goal. By contrast, Allhoff's understanding of a policy (and, implicitly, of norms and principles) is like that of the person (e.g., Godwin) who argues we don't need rules: either the rule will ask us to do what is best, or it won't; in the first case it tells us nothing new, in the second case we should not follow it; so rules are useless.


I said earlier I conceded that sometimes torture in ticking bomb situations may be permissible -- certainly the pure ones where everything is certain. I also think that many of our rights can be forfeited if we act in ways that are grossly unjust and do so in ways that reveal an unwillingness to constrain our behavior in normal ways. I thus think that hanging Eichmann or Saddam Hussein wrongs neither of them (we lack the relevant directed duties). There may be other reasons to object to their execution, but violation of their rights would not be one. A forfeiture view makes it easier to escape the reach of our norms against torturing another human. But a torture program, even as limited as the one Allhoff favors, will torture people who have retained their rights to decent treatment. More importantly, I think Allhoff's understanding of torture is limited. I agree that "torture sometimes works" (141). But I doubt the limited and constrained application of thumb-screws or a couple of water-boardings will do much for us. This is why torture is rarely constrained and normally is quite prolonged.


But it's also the case that torture is not just the infliction of pain. Allhoff discusses David Sussman's interesting thesis that torture forces the subject to betray him- or herself (78-85). Allhoff thinks that Sussman's case is important but concludes nevertheless that "the thing to say is being complicit in one's own betrayal would, in and of itself, exacerbate one's pain and suffering." He leaves it open how we take these considerations, but notes that "As a utilitarian, I do not think there are moral harms beyond pain and suffering" (82). But there is more. Torture is not just the infliction of pain on someone -- and not just the infliction of "minimal" pain (90-1) -- plus the subject's self-betrayal. Usually torture involves the prospect of torture with no clear end short of capitulation or death, and it usually involves the torturer(s) attempting to dominate the subject and to break her will. The last is usually achieved by making the victim very afraid, and by humiliating and degrading her. We may think that these common features of torture are optional, but they seem important to most torture practices, including many of the Bush administration.[2] What torturers do is horrible -- it is horrible to the victims and it is also horrible to the perpetrator. Torture is much more than the limited infliction of pain. It involves breaking the victim's will, reducing the individual to a condition where he or she will obey the torturer's instructions. Humiliation and degradation seem essential to this end, at least if we examine the practice of professionals and experts. It's hard to see how these "moral harms" are properly captured in Allhoff's calculus.


Allhoff considers Seumas Miller's interesting suggestion that the


law in particular, and social institutions more generally, are blunt instruments. They are designed to deal with recurring situations confronted by numerous individuals over relatively long periods of time . . . By contrast with the law, morality is a sharp instrument. Morality can be, and typically ought to be, made to apply to a given situation in all of its particularity. . . (quoted 178)


There is something to Miller's point, but the idea that morality can and ought to be "sharp" and apply to all situations seems illusory. For one thing, on the view of all but act-consequentialists, morality includes norms and principles, directed duties, and a variety of virtues, and their sharpness is limited. In some respects, morality is similar to law (both have norms), and in others it is less sharp (e.g., the common law of torts). But the idea of a morality that could be applied to all situations, in all of their particularity, strikes me as a fantasy -- one attractive to many reformers perhaps, but an illusion nevertheless. I can think of some situations where torture might be permissible, but these situations don't seem to be relevant to our world.


I have not taken up all of the interesting discussions and points in Allhoff's study. His book is an important and skillful challenge to positions widely by many, and I expect it will play a part in our continuing discussions of torture.

[1] David Luban, "Liberalism, torture, and the ticking bomb," in his Torture, Power, and Law (Cambridge University Press, 2014), p. 60.


[2] "Like fear, humiliation and degradation are horror-multipliers to the physical sensations of cruel treatment." Luban, "Unthinking the ticking bomb," in Torture, Power, and Law, p. 97.