Terrorism Unjustified: The Use and Misuse of Political Violence

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Vicente Medina, Terrorism Unjustified: The Use and Misuse of Political Violence, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 289pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781442253513.

Reviewed by Georg Meggle, University of Leipzig/American University in Cairo


This book is on the ethics of terrorism. And its very title already gives us Medina's position: terrorism, being the sort of political violence it is (i.e., terrorism as understood by Medina), is per se unjustified; so every use of this special sort of political violence must be a misuse that is morally to be condemned. Before spelling out and discussing this position, Medina gives us (chapter 1) a short overview of the history of terrorism. In chapters 2-3 he does what every good philosopher has to start with: develops a map of the semantics of the wide field in question, ending up with an explicit definition of the term "terrorism" as used in his own arguments. Medina's main ethical discussion is structured by his distinction between "opponents or critics of terrorism" (chapter 3) and "apologists of terrorism" (chapter 4). He reserves chapter 5, the last, for an extended discussion of the deepest and also hardest problem of terrorism-ethics: terrorism as a reaction to a case of supreme emergency. There is a short postscript which seems to turn the book's main argument on its head, though Medina alludes to this turn from the very beginning: terrorism, though "never justified, . . . might sometimes but rarely be excused" (xii). So, the book's deepest philosophical question in the end boils down to: can there really be a (morally acceptable) excuse for terrorism without there being a moral justification for it? Contrary to Medina, my vote would be no.

The distinction between opponents vs. apologists of terrorism is further subdivided by Medina into hard-core vs. soft-core varieties. "Hard-core opponents . . . condemn terrorism absolutely" (xiii), whereas "hard-core apologists . . . refuse to condemn terrorism absolutely" -- which has the very strange conceptual consequence that even "soft-core apologists [who] justify terrorism by appealing, at times, to just war considerations" are, by their refusing to "condemn terrorism absolutely", a sort of "hard-core apologists", too. (I guess that these misnomers are connected with Medina's deplorable usage of two different terms (opponents vs. apologists), which I will discuss below.)

Medina's offers his own definition of "terrorism" on the first page of his Introduction (xi).  Terrorism, he says:

is the use of political violence by individuals or groups who, with the aim of influencing a domestic or an international audience, deliberately or recklessly inflict substantive undeserved harm or threaten to do so on those who can beyond reasonable doubt be conceived of as innocent noncombatants.

This definition is dubbed "the Opponents' working definition of terrorism" (59), confronted later with the following alternative "Apologist's working definition":

The use of political violence by individuals or groups, provided they are not engaged in an interstate armed conflict, who deliberately inflict substantive harm or threaten to do so against their alleged enemies, aiming at influencing a domestic or international audience. (94

Let us for the sake of convenience refer to these different types of terrorism as, respectively, T*- and T-terrorism.

Both definitions are the result of an extensive and quite detailed discussion of alternative proposals made by some of the leading theorists in this highly contested field. There is very much to be gained by reading this discussion very carefully, i.e., sentence by sentence; and I would like to recommend this (slow) reading to every student entering this intricate topic. There is no better, or more effective, method for warming-up when seeking to develop a critical approach to our terrorism-discourse.

Unfortunately, this kind of preparation is already necessary for coming to grips with Medina's own (not always sufficiently explicit and systematic) conceptual arguments. For example, compare the diverse logical relations between T*- and T-terrorism. Which is the stronger or the weaker one, respectively? (A question not put forward by Medina himself.) This would depend on what aspect of each definition you are focusing on. First, there is the level of context: T-terrorism, in contrast to T*-terrorism, is restricted to situations that are not interstate armed conflicts. So, with regards to this level, T* defines a more general concept than T. And so it is with regards to the level of intentionality: in order to count as a T-terrorist, the harm you are inflicting or threatening to inflict has to be a deliberate one, whereas in the T* case your harm may merely be a deliberate or a reckless one. On the third level of harm, it is the other way round: in the T* case the harm in question has to be an undeserved one, whereas in T the question of harm being deserved or undeserved can be left open. Lastly, there is the fourth -- and (also from Medina's point of view) for the whole moral issue the most important -- level of targets: in T-terrorism the intended harm-targets are the terrorist's "alleged enemies", whereas in T*-terrorism the targets are "innocent non-combatants". Now, as already implied by the term "alleged enemies" (my italics) itself, "enmity" is a "deeply subjective" term (95), whereas "innocent non-combatants" has and is intended by Medina to have a strongly objective ring. (For an extensive and excellent discussion of these terms, including many historical references, see 79-101.) However, although targeting "innocents" does not strictly entail that these targets are, from the point of view of the harming actor, taken to be also his or her "alleged enemies", I think that we nevertheless may, as far as this fourth conceptual level is concerned, regard T* as defining a much stronger concept than the more general T.

Now, this distinction between T* and T simpliciter, as descriptively sound as it may be relative to the normal or even philosophical usage of the term "terrorism", turns out to be theoretically deeply misleading -- at least when combined with Medina's distinction between opponents and apologists of terrorism. Since T* and T represent different types of behavior, opponents and apologists do not contradict each other: whereas T-terrorism -- political violence directed at "alleged enemies" -- may be sometimes morally justifiable, T*-terrorism -- political violence directed at "those who can be conceived of as innocent noncombatants beyond reasonable doubt" -- may (absolutely or nearly) never be justified. Just to highlight two of the positions mentioned by Medina himself: Ted Honderich is a clear T-terrorism-apologist; Michael Walzer and Medina (and -- up to now - myself) are clear T*-terrorism-opponents. But notice, that without reference to T* versus T, respectively, these terms do not make much sense. I could be classified as an apologist and an opponent of terrorism at the same time! Yet it is these (unspecified) distinctions which are at the very center of the whole argument of Medina's book.

Both of Medina's definitions are a plea for a terrorism without (reference to the element of) terror (fear). In this, Medina is following C. A. J. Coady (compare 59 f.), "who prefers to exclude fear from a definition of terrorism for two reasons": (i) because "stress upon this intended effect [namely, to use violence in order to create terror/fear] tends to preclude any serious concern with . . . the type of method used to generate fear", and (ii) that, re T*, "we are prejudging an empirical investigation into the specific motives of those who choose to attack noncombatants". In contrast to Medina, for me these reasons are not compelling at all. To the contrary, both considerations are quite beside the point. For example, just take the definition of David Fromkin (not mentioned by Medina, but most favored by me): "Terrorism is to make use of violence in order to create fear. And this fear shall in turn cause someone else to change his way of acting so that the final goal of the terrorist activities is achieved" (Foreign Affairs 53, 1975). Why should this definition, which includes the reference to fear as aimed at by the agent's violence, really "preclude any serious concern with . . . the method used to generate fear"? If this concern has to be, as Medina via Coady seems to suppose, really a serious one, then this would be rather an argument for not forgetting about this factor. And the same holds for (ii) above: I just can't see why Fromkin's definition should "distract people from that which is seriously objectionable about terrorism, namely the deliberate or reckless targeting of innocent noncombatants" (59). True, in Fromkin's definition this aspect of "targeting of innocent noncombatants" is not even mentioned; but if this is an argument against this definition, then it would be also one against Medina's own definition T, wherein this aspect is not mentioned either.

In addition to Coady's no-fear argument, Medina warns us that "by including fear [in the definition of terrorism] one can end up classifying acts of benign intimidation as terrorist acts when these acts might have been motivated by diverse reasons, including bantering, amusing, or simply educating others" (60). Here Medina opens the discussion of a case which, I suspect, will deliver good material for many lively discussions in seminars on the semantics of terrorism (if there are any such courses): "Consider, for example, (Microsoft founder) Bill Gates's stunt act of releasing mosquitoes at an elite Technology, Entertainment, Design (TED) conference intending to cause fear and thereby alert the audience about the devastating consequences that malaria has. . . in underdeveloped countries". Medina takes this scenario to deliver a counterexample against the necessity of the fear-component in a terrorist act definition. But his argument confuses a necessary condition with a sufficient one. "If one allows that the intention to spread fear needs to be incorporated into a definition of terrorism, then one could portray Gates's stunt as a terrorist act" (60). True, to "conclude that Gates's act resembles a terrorist act . . . seems a hasty conclusion", but this hastiness does in fact not follow from fear being postulated as an additional necessary condition, but from the fact that some of the other conditions necessary for an act to be a terrorist one are not given in this case, as Medina himself sees: Gates "never intended to inflict serious harm on anyone" (61).

The cornerstone of Medina's (mainly deontological version of the) ethics of terrorism is the Principle of Non-Combatant-Immunity (PNCI). Terrorism as defined in T* entails the PNCI's violation -- and so, as the PNCI is taken to be (by Medina) an absolute principle, this definition in combination with the PNCI entails also the absolute wrongness of T*-terrorism. The involved concepts (of non-combatants, citizens, innocence etc.) are given a broad and again very impressively detailed discussion. This discussion takes place both in the context of the various strands of just war theory and of all sorts of double-effect reasoning, a field in which Medina is without doubt one of our greatest masters. So, this discussion will be highly appreciated by any philosopher (like myself) who is fond of sophisticated jesuitical arguments. This will be particularly so for any philosophy teachers who are looking for present-day examples to discuss in their applied terrorist-ethics courses. Moreover, as an aside, the bibliography and the comments in the "notes" of this book deliver one of the best overviews of our topic available today.

It has to be stressed that Medina never shies away from drawing very explicit evaluative conclusions, as when he, for example, notes that "sometimes there is virtually no distinction between the behavior of statesmen and the behavior of terrorists" (207) and bluntly reminds us that the Nobel Peace Prize has been awarded to some individuals "who have been associated with a great deal of unlawful violence, such as . . . Henry Kissinger" (157). As early as in his Introduction he warns us that "While the threat of terrorism is real, we need to learn how to live with this menace without succumbing to an unreasonable fear of it that could permanently undermine our civil and political rights" (xiv).

The book's most valuable aspect is that its second half centers around the hardest (but not very often openly debated) question in terrorism ethics: what if we are faced with a situation, when, however much we would like to condemn terrorism, we have no other choice than to make use of terrorism? I do not know of any other book in which this crucial topic has been given so much attention. It is this aspect that makes reading it a must for everyone interested in the ethics of terrorism.

In just war theory the parallel most crucial question would be this one: Could there be any W-situation (i.e. a catastrophic worst case of Armageddon dimensions) in which we were, in order to avoid or end this situation, forced to disregard all of the traditional just war restrictions, even our basic PNCI? Could there be cases in which we would have no choice than to commit even the worst war crimes or crimes against humanity? Such W-cases or, as Winston Churchill had dubbed them, cases of "supreme emergency", have been already discussed in Michael Walzer's classic Just and Unjust Wars (which refers to Churchill's "Terror Bombing" of German cities in WWII) and by some other brave thinkers later on. Again: those seeking a detailed summary of these discussions will be excellently served by Medina's book. And in this discussion again, Medina delivers superb examples (with various highly illuminating versions) for an acute discussion of these W-cases. For a paradigm case, see 133 f., where President Obama has been briefed that the leadership of al-Qaeda "has managed to obtain a powerful nuclear weapon to carry out a nuclear attack in an undisclosed foreign capital", the leadership has announced that they will detonate this weapon very soon, and it is known that they "have an undetermined number of innocent American hostages to be used as human shields, if necessary, to try to prevent a US attack on them"--Obama having to decide whether to preemptively attack the al-Qaeda position in question.

Well, what would be the morally correct choice in this case? That is, I think, not really an open question: Obama must opt for attacking, even though in this case we all (including Obama) know that by this attack the innocent hostages will be killed, too.

So far, Medina would agree. However, he would not also subscribe to the (for me obviously evident) conclusion that in this case Obama was morally justified (and so, as I would say with regards to this kind of situation, even morally obliged) to give his order to attack. Why not? Because then we would have to subscribe to the conclusion that the PNCI does not hold absolutely. And this, I guess, for Medina would mean the end of any viable (deontological) ethics of war and terrorism. Instead Medina has recourse to something which I would classify as a typical case of doublespeak: according to Medina, such violence to the PNCI can be "never justified", but in this exceptional case only "might be excused".

This debate would be an excellent chance to start a general meta-ethical discussion about what is involved in doing applied ethics. What is the best way to solve our problem of having to make a choice between a change of content (of some moral rules) versus a linguistic change (such as substituting "excuses" for "justifications")?

Of course, Medina spends a lot of effort trying to justify his "fundamental normative distinction between excusing and justifying an act" (204), referring to J. L. Austin's "A Plea for Excuses" (238 n. 126), focusing on the moral relevance of intentions beside and beyond consequences (204), and even postulating the relativity of our moral norms to normal situations (205). But for me, none of these arguments are convincing and I would not like to agree that we have to accept this distinction, "if we want our view of [a violation of the PNCI in general and then of] terrorism [in particular] to be practical rather than ideal" (my italics). W-cases and references to them are part of our real (practical) life; and so the norms of our ethics (terrorism ethics included) have to be norms not only for normal cases, but for these extreme cases as well. In ethics there is no place for any doublespeak.

Medina was right in expecting that this book "will not necessarily end debates about the nature, justification, or excuse of terrorism" (xii). It leaves more questions open than answered. But at the present state of the art in terrorism ethics, this may be the best an author can hope for. Medina's book is an important contribution and one that propels our ethics of terrorism to a new and higher level.