Testimony, Trust, and Authority

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Benjamin McMyler, Testimony, Trust, and Authority, Oxford University Press, 2011, 178pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199794331.

Reviewed by Edward S. Hinchman, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


Testimony plays two apparently different roles in our lives. On the one hand, when a speaker tells her addressee that p she may thereby enable him to know that p. On the other hand, such a telling may help build a distinctive sort of relationship between speaker and addressee. We tend to trust as an authority any speaker who regularly provides us with knowledge in this way, the ongoing relationship marked by an interpersonal dynamic more complex than that required for any single testimonial exchange. Since these functional roles are obviously interconnected, one may ask which is more fundamental. Is the testimonial relationship a reflection of how the speaker can give her addressee knowledge? Or is the speaker's capacity to give knowledge a reflection of the broader relationship in which she stands to her addressee?

Benjamin McMyler argues for the latter position. His book addresses three issues: the interpersonal dimension of testimony, the nature of the epistemic reasons made available through testimony, and the nature of testimonial trust. He treats each issue as a facet of the book's core question: how can an addressee gain knowledge from testimony? In Chapter 1, McMyler considers the question from an historical perspective, usefully including some bits of its early history passed over by other authors. Chapter 2 presents McMyler's position as a species of non-reductionism -- that is, as the claim that the epistemic reasons made available through testimony cannot be reduced to evidence grounded in inductive inference from more basic sources of knowledge. In Chapter 3, he distinguishes his version of non-reductionism from other versions by articulating a "new debate" among three models of testimony: what he calls the evidential, inheritance, and second-personal models. Chapter 4 argues that his second-personal model of testimony can underwrite a general model of interpersonal trust. And Chapter 5 argues that it can underwrite a thesis about the nature of second-personal reasons. Though others have published broadly similar treatments of these issues in essay form, this is one of two book-length defenses of the interpersonal approach to testimony that appeared in 2011. (The other is Paul Faulkner's Knowledge on Trust, also published by Oxford University Press.)

McMyler thus aims to explain how testimony can give knowledge in terms of the testimonial relationship, rather than explaining the testimonial relationship in terms of its capacity to give knowledge. Any such argument confronts two immediate problemsboth (i) insincere testifiers and (ii) sincere but truth-conducively unreliable testifiers seem capable of giving testimony, yet (esoteric cases aside) we tend to think that insincere or unreliable testimony cannot provide distinctively testimonial knowledge. Though a hearer may learn something from the speech act indirectly, insincerity and truth-conducive unreliability each prevent testimony from providing knowledge in the more direct way that involves the testimonial relationship as such. I'll explain McMyler's argument by considering how it treats these two problem cases.

I. The problem of insincere testifiers

McMyler's thesis is that the epistemic reason to believe that p made available through testimony that p is second-personal -- that is, directly grounded in the relationship between speaker S and addressee A when S tells A that p. How could the reason be grounded in the relationship? McMyler argues that the basis of the reason lies in the "burden" (63) of epistemic responsibility that the speaker "assumes" (68) when she tells A that p. Note that this is still just a necessary condition on the acquisition of testimonial knowledge; more conditions must be met (one of which I'll discuss in the next section). But McMyler presents it as the key condition (68). The epistemic reason -- the core of knowledge -- derives from a personal relationship that has, he argues, this structure: the speakerassumes epistemic responsibility for the testimony, while the audience acknowledges the speaker's assumption of responsibility for the testimony. The relationship can ground the epistemic reason because it gives the addressee an "epistemic right" (62) to defer to the speaker justificatory challenges to his entitlement to believe that p.

What is it to 'assume responsibility' in this manner? One question is whether the speaker's assumption of responsibility is directly psychological or illocutionary. If we say the latter, then the speaker's obligation to be responsive when the addressee defers challenges derives from the illocutionary nature of testimonial telling -- by virtue of how that speech act necessarily represents the speaker as acting with complex intentions. It follows from the illocutionary view that an insincere testifier acquires the burden of responsibility as much as a sincere testifier, since each represents herself as having the intentions that define the illocution. This assumption of responsibility is ultimately psychological, of course, insofar as representing yourself as having these complex intentions is psychological. But it is not directly psychological, given that you can acquire the burden even when you have no intention of discharging it. On the illocutionary view, you assume the burden of responsibility by performing the speech act of telling.

McMyler makes it clear that he rejects the illocutionary view. "Testimonial knowledge cannot be acquired from insincere testimony," he argues, simply because

Insincere testimony is testimony in which a speaker merely purports to assume the epistemic responsibilities involved in testifying, and according to the second-personal model testimonial knowledge cannot be acquired through the merely purported assumption of such responsibilities (103).

In some places McMyler appears to hold that insincere testimony isn't genuine testimony at all, nor trust in insincere testimony genuine testimonial trust, since "To testify is to assume such an epistemic responsibility [viz. the responsibility that the insincere speaker "merely purports to assume" (103)], and to trust a speaker for the truth is to rely epistemically on this assumption of responsibility" (93). Again, "this assumption of epistemic responsibility should be understood as an assumption to meet certain epistemic challenges to the audience's testimonial belief" (93). It follows that an insincere speaker (who may not by virtue of her insincerity even count as offering genuine testimony) has not assumed responsibility in the way that gives her addressee a right to defer challenges to her. McMyler presents this thesis as part of what distinguishes the second-personal model from the evidential and inheritance models. If that's right, then any account that takes the illocutionary view would not instantiate the second-personal model -- however much the account emphasizes the epistemic import of testimonial assurance, authority, or trust.

Is it plausible that an addressee lacks the right to defer challenges to an insincere speaker? People frequently lie: do we really have no epistemic right to defer challenges to them? The fact that a liar can't or won't meet the challenge doesn't show that she isn't under a burden -- that is, an obligation -- to meet it. Sincere testifiers often can't and sometimes won't even try to meet a given challenge, but they're nonetheless, as McMyler emphasizes, under an obligation to meet the challenge. Of course, if you know a speaker is insincere, you won't depend on her to answer challenges. But to defer a challenge is not necessarily to depend on the speaker. And we often don't know when a given speaker is insincere.

It does seem that any account that emphasizes second-personal elements in testimony must hold that one cannot acquire testimonial knowledge from insincere testimony. But McMyler explains this restriction by positing an implausible restriction on the addressee's epistemic right of deferral. Given the implausibility of ruling out insincere testimony by such a direct appeal to the speaker's psychology, we might regard it as a condition of adequacy on any second-personal model that it take the illocutionary view. Perhaps we can embrace the illocutionary view, acknowledge that insincerity does not block the right of deferral, yet still explain how only sincere testimony can make available an epistemic reason. Such an account would not let everything ride on the epistemic right of deferral, but other philosophers (for example, Faulkner) have developed accounts that emphasize second-personal elements that go beyond the burdens of replying to justificatory challenges.

II. The problem of truth-conducively unreliable testifiers

In Chapter 5, eight pages from the end of the book, it emerges that there is a further crucial necessary condition on the acquisition of testimonial knowledge: as a "background condition" the testifier must not only be sincere but display relevant "competence and reliability" (162). The formulation exceeds what McMyler has argued thus far, that "In order for a speaker's testimony that p to amount to a reason for the audience to believe that p, the audience must judge the speaker to be epistemically competent or authoritative with respect to p" (157; this idea was introduced in Chapter 3). McMyler now claims that the testifier must not only be judged relevantly authoritative but actually be so. The speaker must be "competent and reliable," he now claims, as a necessary condition on being "in a position to herself generate the reason for belief provided by her coming out and telling the audience that p" (162).

Though the rationale is not entirely explicit, McMyler appears to add this further condition because he needs to exclude certain cases in which the testifier taken on her own, apart from the given testimonial relation, is simply not in a position to provide anyone with knowledge. Intuitively (and many epistemologists think they can articulate why this intuition is correct), epistemic reasons derive most fundamentally from a connection not to practices of justification or relations of epistemic dependence but to truth: an epistemic reason is necessarily a consideration (or perhaps just a fact) that makes a belief likely to be true. McMyler accepts this view of epistemic reasons when he articulates what he calls the evidentialist constraint on reasons for belief: "a consideration is evidence for a proposition p just in case it counts in favor of the truth of, confirms, or probabilifies p" (153). But all the conditions that McMyler lays out in earlier chapters can be met in a given case -- the speaker assumes epistemic responsibility in addressing the hearer, the addressee acquires the epistemic right of deferral, sincerity and trust abound -- while no epistemic reason is made available or acquired because either (a) the speaker doesn't know the proposition that she asserts, or (b) though she does know the proposition she is not truth-conducively reliable as a testifier (e.g., because she has a history of ignorant testimony on this subject matter). In Chapter 5, McMyler reveals that he would rule out cases (a) and (b) simply by noting that the speaker in these cases is not relevantly competent or reliable.

This move seems fundamentally at odds with McMyler's second-personal model. Drawing on the evidentialist constraint, McMyler formulates the second-personal model as follows:

not only are testimonial reasons evidential, not only do they genuinely count in favor of the truth of the proposition believed, but they do so precisely in virtue of the interpersonal relations of authority and responsibility existing between addresser and addressee (155).

The word 'authority' just expresses the reason-giving quality at issue here, so it cannot be what explains how these reasons are evidential. That leaves the word 'responsibility.' So we get this thesis: a testimonial reason counts in favor of the truth of the proposition because of the responsibility relation instituted by the testimony. But how could the assumption or the acknowledgment of responsibility on its own -- or, working together, on their own -- "count in favor of the truth" of a proposition (other than a proposition about the relationship in question), given the possibility that the speaker is not truth-conducively reliable? As we've seen, McMyler rules out this possibility in the last few pages of the book by stipulating as a "background condition" that truth-conducively unreliable speakers cannot give epistemic reasons through testimony. But that condition then seems to do all the work in ensuring that the testimonial relationship is properly evidential, in terms of McMyler's own evidentialist constraint. Neither the speaker's assumption of responsibility nor indeed any aspect of her relationship with her addressee appears to be doing any strictly evidential work in this explanation.

The problem also infects McMyler's more general treatment of trust in Chapter 4. McMyler poses this problem for a theory of trust: how can trusting someone to φ amount to a belief that the trusted will φ while also manifesting a second-personal attitude toward the trusted? He explains how trust amounts to belief while remaining a second-personal attitude by drawing on the book's core thesis: that a trust relationship can itself yield genuine evidence for the proposition that the trusted will do what she is trusted to do. Trusting S to φ thus amounts to believing that S will φ on the evidence provided by that very trust. How can a trust relationship provide such evidence? Well, there's a "background" condition (138): the truster must believe the trusted is relevantly trustworthy. But how does that help, given that the belief may well prove false? To get a genuinely epistemic reason, McMyler must stipulate that the trusted actually is relevantly trustworthy, where the core of such trustworthiness is truth-conducive reliability. The weaker formulation in Chapter 4 must yield to the stronger formulation embraced in Chapter 5. But now the account no longer looks second-personal.

III. Are testimonial reasons second-personal?

In defending a second-personal model of testimony, McMyler explicitly counters an aspect of Stephen Darwall's well-known account of second-personal reasons. Darwall briefly argues that testimony only appears to give second-personal reasons: because the speaker invites the addressee to treat her as a guide to the truth, her reason-giving does not engage any genuinely second-personal competence of his -- only a third-personal competence to let his beliefs be informed by the truth.[1] As McMyler notes (152), Darwall is not assuming reductionism. The point at issue is whether these apparently second-personal reasons can be reduced to third-personal reasons, not whether testimonial reasons can be reduced to reasons deriving from other sources. McMyler pursues a lengthy reply to Darwall's objection to the second-personal model of testimony in Chapter 5, two aspects of which are crucial to the book's argument as a whole.

First, McMyler argues that it does not threaten the second-personality of his account to posit the reliability condition that we've discussed, because the need for such a background condition arises also in the cases of command that Darwall treats as paradigmatically second-personal. It is certainly true that when someone commands you to do something, you might wonder whether her command is informed by relevant species of competence or reliability. But this claim is crucially ambiguous, since Darwall's account of second-personality enforces a distinction between two different respects in which a question of competence or reliability could arise, and McMyler's argument does nothing to show that testimony is relevantly like a command in the respect at issue. On the one hand, there is the authority that is presumed simply in performing the particular speech act: she presumes she is authorized to perform it. On the other hand, there is the authority that the speech act is presumed to have for the addressee: she presumes that the speech act carries this authority. Darwall poses his challenge to the second-personality of testimonial reasons in terms of the second species of authority, for it is only there that the addressee taps into the speaker's authority, possibly acquiring a second-personal reason.

McMyler is correct to observe that background 'competence' conditions must be met with regard to both species of authority, whether for commanding or for testifying. On the one hand, the speaker must count as relevantly competent in order to be authorized (by relevant illocutionary norms) to perform the speech act. On the other hand, the speaker must count as relevantly competent in order for the speech act, so authorized, to carry authority for -- that is, give reasons to -- the addressee. These competence conditions must differ insofar as the two species of authority differ. One immediate difference emerges when we note that no question of 'reliability' figures in the first competence condition. We can ask whether someone is 'competent' to issue a command -- that is: Is she authorized, does she have the first species of authority, to do so?

But if we ask whether a speaker is 'reliable' in issuing a command we raise a completely different question: not whether the command may be issued with whatever force it may have, but whether the command is a good command in some additional sense. We can thus ask how reliable the command is -- but we're not thereby asking 'how authorized' the speaker was to issue it. Though a military commander will presumably need to have demonstrated relevant species of reliability at some point in the (perhaps distant) past in order to gain her office, she may now be perfectly authorized -- and in this respect competent -- to issue a command in battle despite being unreliable in doing so. To say that she's unreliable is to say that her command is not likely to be good -- e.g., strategically intelligent. But if she is commanding within the rights of her office -- and other background conditions are met (she's not insane, the war hasn't ended, etc.) -- then her command does have authority for her addressees. Darwall argues that that authority is second-personal and as such depends only on the second-personal competence exercised through her second-personal mode of address. Darwall argues, and McMyler does not question this argument, that the authority that the command has for the addressee does not depend on the commander's status as reliable.

It is therefore at best misleading to say that a 'reliability' condition lies in the background of a command. There is indeed a 'competence' condition for commands insofar as (i) a command must be authorized and (ii) the command's authority for the addressee depends on its being competently addressed. But neither of these competence conditions is a 'reliability' condition. By contrast, the second 'competence' condition on testimonial telling -- enabling the telling to carry authority for the addressee -- is at its core a 'reliability' condition. So McMyler's appeal to a background condition on telling merely serves to emphasize the point on which Darwall is insisting: that the reason-givingness of testimony -- the respect in which testimonial tellings carry authority for the addressee -- functions third-personally.

In a second move (which precedes and does not depend on the argument just considered), McMyler argues that the epistemic distinction between telling A that p and arguing that p (where the latter leaves A to draw his own conclusion) parallels the practical distinction between commanding and advising. McMyler accepts Darwall's claim that the reason-givingness of advice is third-personal, since (as McMyler puts it) "the audience is charged with coming to its own conclusion about" the advice (159).[2] But he argues that "telling differs from arguing precisely in that it does not involve presenting the audience with considerations that the audience is charged with coming to its own conclusion about" (159).

This argument appears to depend on a slide between two senses of 'coming to one's own conclusion.' Sense 1: A comes to his own conclusion about the reason-giving force of a speech act iff A treats the speech act as input to further deliberation. Sense 2: A comes to his own conclusion about the reason-giving force of a speech act iff A cannot acquire the reason unless A assesses (or is otherwise appropriately responsive to) the speaker's status as relevantly reliable in performing the speech act. In sense 1, A comes to his own conclusion about the subject matter of the speech act. In sense 2, A comes to his own conclusion about the speech act, or about the speaker, as regards its or her status as authoritative (in the second respect distinguished above). Darwall is arguing that telling is like advising (and not like commanding) only in sense 2. But McMyler is arguing that telling is not like advising (but instead like commanding) only in sense 1. His argument therefore seems to miss its target.

Other philosophers have published similar objections to accounts of testimony similar to McMyler's (for example, Jennifer Lackey in 2008 and Frederick Schmitt in 2010[3]), but McMyler does not discuss these objections at all. (He acknowledges that Lackey has argued against Richard Moran's assurance view of testimony, but he claims merely that her argument does not "appear" to apply to his own view (102), despite acknowledged similarities between his view and Moran's on precisely the point at issue in Lackey's criticism.[4]) Since Darwall's is the only objection that McMyler considers at length, it is worth seeing how the intuitions on which it draws (which also drive Lackey's and Schmitt's more complex objections) retain their force. A relationship of trust and authority often lies at the core of the epistemic relation whereby a testifier makes knowledge available to her addressee. The question is whether that interpersonal relationship can itself explain the epistemic relation. I myself believe that it can, but I do not see how it can if we restrict our attention to the resources developed in this book.

[1] The Second-Person Standpoint (Harvard University Press, 2006), 57, 123-4.

[2] He plausibly dissents from Darwall's separable idea that the reason-givingness of advice is epistemic.

[3] Jennifer Lackey, Learning from Words (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008), Chapter 8; Frederick F. Schmitt, "The Assurance View of Testimony," in Adrian Haddock, Alan Millar, and Duncan Pritchard (eds), Social Epistemology (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010).

[4] Richard Moran, "Getting Told and Being Believed," Philosophers' Imprint 5 (2005). McMyler is explicit about the many respects in which his account follows Moran's. McMyler maintains that his own account puts more emphasis than Moran's on the epistemic right of deferral, but it is not clear how that emphasis defuses Lackey's objection.