The Act of Being: The Philosophy of Revelation in Mulla Sadra

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Christian Jambet, The Act of Being: The Philosophy of Revelation in Mulla Sadra, (trans. Jeff Fort), Zone Books, 2006, 497pp., $38.95 (hbk), ISBN 1890951692.

Reviewed by David Burrell, C.S.C., University of Notre Dame / Tantur Ecumenical Institute (Jerusalem)


A superb translation of L'acte de l'etre (Paris: Fayard 2002), this comprehensive presentation of Muhammad Ibn Ibrahim Sadr al-Din Shirazi [Mulla Sadra] will help western philosophers and theologians to come to appreciate the trajectory of Islamic thought which extends beyond the stereotype prevailing in the west:  that Islamic philosophy all but evaporated after al-Ghazali's trenchant attack on Ibn Rushd [Averroes].  It rather moved back to the heartland from Andalusia, in the personages of Suhrwaradi, Ibn al-Arabi, and later, Mulla Sadra, as well as countless lesser luminaries, as Sayyed Hossain Nasr has been reminding us for some time.  I came to realize the truth of Nasr's contention in the first Mulla Sadra conference in Teheran in 1999, where the participants were overwhelmingly impressed with the contemporary vigor of philosophy (and poetry) in Iran.  That event gave me the opportunity to compare Mulla Sadra's attitude towards existence with that of Thomas Aquinas, using Henri Corbin's edition and translation of Mulla Sadra's Masha'ir [Les Penetrations Metaphysiques] (see "Thomas Aquinas (1225-1274) and Mulla Sadra Shirazi (980/1572-1050/1640) and the Primacy of esse/wujûd in Philosophical Theology," Medieval Philosophy and Theology 8 [1999] 207-19).  With no ostensible connection between them, there is an uncanny correspondence between their respective views on the primacy of existence [esse/wujûd], precisely as linking creatures with the creator.  Fascination with this philosopher, whom most of us from the west had barely heard of, led me to translate portions of Volume 1 of the Asfar al-arbaîn [Four Spiritual Journeys] on existence, which -- in sh'Allah! -- will appear before long in conjunction with his reflections of "the return," which conclude that work, to show how emanation from and return to "the One" structures his metaphysics. 

Short of participating in the Mulla Sadra conferences in Tehran (1999, 2004), this work of Christian Jambet, himself a student of Henri Corbin, now rendered into English by Jeff Fort (in collaboration with the author), will astutely, if not persuasively, introduce western philosophers, and especially philosophical theologians, to this fruitful seventeenth century Iranian thinker who composed in Arabic.  It should also help convince historians of Islamic philosophy of Nasr's contention, by showing how fruitfully the legacy of Ibn Sina has been extended beyond Ibn Rushd. (My forthcoming contribution to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy offers a fresh periodization of Islamic philosophy, turning axially on al-Ghazali, in an attempt to highlight his philosophical role [].)  Jambet displays a mastery of the corpus of Mulla Sadra, whom he identifies as "proposing the completed ontology of Islam" (116), attributing (in part) the lucidity of presentation to the translator, who has served us all by giving the original work "another life in a fitting and adequate philosophical language, in all faithfulness to the original French" (16).  Beginning with a brief sketch of this remarkable thinker's life, placing him in the rich vein of Shi'ite philosophical reflection yet firmly distinguishing him from the "school of Isfahan," this elaboration of his thought then continues in a more thematic way, with three major parts:  "the metaphysical revolution," "the existential revolution," and "salvation," where the first focuses on the genealogy of ishrāqi ("eastern") thought with special attention to its continuity with "the Avicennian moment," the second on the specific contribution of Mulla Sadra's insistence on the "primacy of existence," and the third on "the return" which complements the emanation of all-that-is from the One. This triptych effectively displays the ways his metaphysics attempts to express the ineffable relation of creatures to the creator, in their coming forth and returning, effecting a transformation in Avicenna's focus on essence not unlike that of Aquinas, and for similar reasons:  to align the structures of the universe with free creation.  The nub of this novel emphasis is a rich understanding of existence [wujûd (Mulla Sadra), esse (Aquinas)] as expressing creatures' continuing link with the creating action of God, displaying both continuity and contrast with his predecessor Suhrawardi, and inspired throughout by the work of Ibn al-Arabi.       

Expositors of Mulla Sadra are prone to identify his specific contribution as "essential motion," and Jambet is no exception.  Yet his delineation of this feature of Mulla Sadra's metaphysics is detailed enough to avoid misconstruing this phrase, "essential motion."  For it is less an anticipation of Whitehead than it is an explication of Aristotle, modified by asserting the primacy of existing, which (as in Aquinas) restores the dynamism inherent in Aristotelian nature; something which a more conceptual rendering of essence, found in Ibn Sina had effectively obscured.  For Aristotle, the paradigms for substance had always been individual living things, whose growth and development were guided by an internal principle, nature [physis] which, defined as the species, became the essence.  In short, the genius of Aristotle is expressed in the inherent link between logical and physical/metaphysical, which some of his successors managed to pry apart, usually with greater attention to the logical.  In that process, essence became "static," while nature for Aristotle was always the principle of growth and development, as act in physical things always connoted direction towards a (yet unfinished) goal.  So a proper understanding of Aristotle, which gives primacy to act, entails motion essentially.  And the simplest way to give primacy to act is to make the maneuver which both Aquinas and Mulla Sadra did:  to re-conceive Aristotelian essence as potential to the act of existing -- the appropriate title of this exposition.  Such a recasting of potency/act is doubtless a transformation of Aristotle, but less an innovation than a genial way of focusing elements virtual in his thought, accentuating them in such a way as to leave room for a creator as well as to gesture at the continuing relation of all things with that One.  So the slogan, "primacy of existence," signals a theological turn in one's metaphysics, a turn which a "thin" Quinean view of existence elides and obscures, suggesting how Mulla Sadra's development becomes clearly relevant to contemporary "philosophy of religion," by offering a stark contrast with some of its practitioners. 

Section two continues with two more specific contributions of Mulla Sadra, tracing how each takes stock of earlier Islamic thinkers.  An illuminating chapter details the way al-Ghazali's treatment of the manifold dimensions of the human heart contributes to Mulla Sadra's development of the elusive notion of soul, noting how Sadra takes issue with Avicenna's manifest dualism.  Chapter eight then displays how integrally imagination, or "the imaginal world," functions in his thought, revealing substantive links with both Avicenna and with Suhrawardi.  Canvassing these predecessors' views in detail displays the diverse understandings of imagination with which Mulla Sadra had to contend, showing how his emendations converged to attempt a proper understanding of "the 'realities of the other world', that is, the realities of heaven and hell" (338).  For imagination had figured centrally in Islamic understanding of prophecy, specifically in showing how prophets -- and notably the Prophet -- exceed philosophers in wisdom, since their renderings of divine realities are fashioned in such a way as to sway the minds and hearts of all, thanks to the way appropriate images function to assist humans' understanding of such recondite realities.  As Jambet puts it, "the imagination is situated between the power of political leadership and the power of pure contemplation," thus acting as a kind of intermediary (or barzakh [isthmus]) between the intelligible and sensible worlds (298, 319).  All of which has prepared us, first metaphysically and then anthropologically, for section three on "the return," entitled "Salvation."

Chapter eight, entitled "Philosophy of Spirit," details how each human being is called to an individuation proper to him or herself, identified by Mulla Sadra as the "second birth of the soul," in which "the becoming of each man is an internal becoming," epitomized in "the emergence of an other worldly form in which he will come to know his reward or his punishment" (356-7, 354).  Western readers cannot help but recall Dante, whose pilgrimage, elaborated in poetry so designed to entice readers into its interior dynamics, offers a paradigm for Sadra's intent here:  to illustrate the inner call of "individuation" built into each human soul.  Aristotle could insist that to be human is to be called to a journey of becoming what one truly is; Islamic thought radically individualizes that call as an invitation of One who knows each creature from within in freely creating him or her.  So having traced the metaphysical and anthropological infrastructure for returning to the One from whom all creatures come, yet to whom intellectual creatures are invited freely to respond, Sadra can now complete the picture by venturing, with the help of rich yet often ambiguous Qur'anic imagery, to render that return in a properly philosophical idiom.  So chapter nine, "return into God," begins pointedly: 

Resurrection is not the fulfillment of the separate existence endowed with a particular essence.  It is the triumph of absolute existence, delivered from all limitation and led back to its original unity… . But this origin was the nothingness prior to creation… . At the end of time, every particular act of being, accompanied by the shadow of a quiddity, is released from this limitation, and God brings it to a second nothingness … that is, to what is nothingness from the point of view of the separate existent.  From the point of view of God, though, this second nothingness is the absolute real (371).

Like much of his exposition, this forthright statement of Jambet's is offered as a straightforward reading of Mulla Sadra, yet on this occasion not substantiated by references.  What renders it suspect, to this reader, is the way in which it stands in tension with his earlier insistence that human beings attain their proper individuality, not simply from their "quiddity" (or essence), but as a result of a spiritual journey to which each is called.  We are, then, far more than "instantiated essences," which could be one reading of Aristotle's ontology.  What can "essential motion" mean, for humans at least, except this invitation to a journey of "coming near" to the One in ways inescapably proper to each person?  And if that be the case, how can Mulla Sadra's expositor presume that each individual is simply defined by "a shadow of quiddity" which, as a "limitation" must be removed to reach a goal which apparently also eliminates individuality?  In short, if individuation does not attach to essence (or quiddity) but to the prosecution of a journey inscribed in each person by the initial call into being by the creator, how can such an attainment evaporate in the end?  This substantial quibble, let us note, is not with Mulla Sadra but with his expositor:  that "the final nothingness effaces the particular nothingness of the quiddities" (373) may be quite accurate, but what has that to do with the individuation attained by individual existences faithful to their inbuilt calls?  Indeed, nowhere in the extensive chapter which follows is this quite evident objection addressed, and while Jambet's exposition evidences a thorough acquaintance with Mulla Sadra's thought, in its origins as well as its implications, one can also find a tone of "mastery" and of confident interpretation which may not always be warranted. 

This indescribable consummation is completed in the final chapter on "the God of epiphanies" (ch. 10), which itself culminates in a remarkable reading of the famous Quranic verse:  "There is no compulsion in religion" (Q 2:256).  'Religion' is parsed in two ways, exterior and interior, as the sense of this verse is taken personally rather than politically, so that the true servants of God reach a point where their response is one of "authentic freedom" coincident with "divine spontaneity" (422), effectively transcending a commonplace understanding of "free will" as implicated with choice.  The proliferation of "worlds" revealed in the end may overwhelm sober western readers, but efflorescence is the very stuff of a Shi'ite imaginary.  Yet the fact that it must be an "imaginary" also indicates my sole reservation regarding this remarkable tour d'horizon of the thought of Mulla Sadra.  There is little doubt of Christian Jambet's intimate and thorough grasp of the sinuous character of Mulla Sadra's multivalent discourse, so one can only respect the reliability of his guidebook.  (And as Jambet reminds us, his able translator has effectively improved the presentation.)  Yet the very thing for which one must praise them both -- a straightforward exposition of the twisting paths of these "four spiritual journeys" -- may unwittingly mislead readers who could then presume themselves able to overlook the concomitant "spiritual exercises" (Pierre Hadot) required of anyone who undertakes them as they must be undertaken -- as interior journeys.  In short, the very clarity of exposition could divert one from that mode of understanding proper to them as journeys.  Yet this could also be an idle critique, since the inevitably outrageous appearance of many of the clearest statements cannot but remind a reader accustomed to sober prose that "something else is going on here."  Perhaps that may suffice to suggest how demanding is this thinker whom Jambet intends to present as "proposing the completed ontology of Islam."