The Actual and the Rational: Hegel and Objective Spirit

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Jean-François Kervégan, The Actual and the Rational: Hegel and Objective Spirit, Daniela Ginsburg and Martin Shuster (trs.), University of Chicago Press, 2018, 384pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226023809.

Reviewed by Frederick Neuhouser, Barnard College, Columbia University


As its title implies, Jean-François Kervégan's book is a comprehensive and systematic reconstruction of Hegel's complex doctrine of objective spirit. It is comprehensive because it aims to explain the whole of that doctrine as set out in the Philosophy of Right, and it is systematic because, unlike many recent accounts of objective spirit, Kervégan refuses to read that text in abstraction from the rest of Hegel's system, within which the Science of Logic occupies pride of place. Kervégan takes a strong position on this issue: "the doctrine of objective spirit, like every part of the system, rests not only on the 'spirit' of the logic but on its letter" (viii). An example of this approach is Kervégan's claim that Hegel's equation of the rational with the actual can avoid the dilemma of being either tautological or fanatically rationalist only by re-examining the meaning of Wirklichkeit as deduced in the Logic. There is, however, a certain ambiguity, as Kervégan recognizes, in emphasizing the importance of reading the Philosophy of Right in relation to the system -- and hence to Hegel's metaphysics -- since it is unclear whether we should equate his metaphysics with the Logic or with the entire doctrine of Absolute Spirit.

I believe that Kervégan's interpretive strategy should be understood as emphasizing the importance of both the Logic and the entire system. One indication that he means to rely on the latter, and not only on the Logic, is his treatment of the contradiction that poverty -- more precisely, the rabble -- appears to pose for Hegel's treatment of civil society: the only way of finding a necessary reconciliation of civil society with itself on this point, according to Kervégan, relies on a "metaethical and metaobjective guarantee" (xii) found in the metaphysics of not only the Logic, but also the doctrine of absolute spirit, which supposedly assures that the contradictions of objective spirit can be resolved at the higher spiritual levels of religion or philosophy. To my mind the real importance of Kervégan's position lies not so much in encouraging us to think about how the philosophy of history might reconcile us to poverty, as in bringing out a feature of Hegel's picture of speculative reason that is seldom acknowledged, namely, that to grasp something philosophically is "to show, within the real, the presence of what 'actually' structures it and what attests to its immanent limitation" (xxxiii, emphasis added). Philosophy's task, in other words, is not merely to reveal the immanent rationality of the real but, more precisely, "to let actuality arrive, within itself, at awareness of its own degree and shape of rationality" (xxxii, my emphases), where this includes, as in the case of civil society, an awareness of the limits of that rationality. In any case, this feature of Kervégan's book alone -- that it attempts to re-introduce Hegel's metaphysics into his account of social and political philosophy -- makes the book worth reading for contemporary, non-metaphysically inclined interpreters.

A further ambiguity in Kervégan's stance with regard to the necessity of a metaphysical interpretation of objective spirit is that he sometimes admits -- plausibly, in my view -- that a good part of the Philosophy of Right "can be coherently understood independently of Hegelian metaphysics" and hence that the former does "not always need to be correlated with the logical-metaphysical structure of the system in order to be judged valid" (xii). This makes Kervégan's approach more pluralistic than his initial statements on this topic might suggest. If we fit these apparently divergent interpretive claims together, Kervégan's position appears to amount to the reasonable claim that while much of the Philosophy of Right can be grasped apart from Hegel's metaphysics, doing so necessarily leaves certain central problems raised by the former unresolved, and in these cases Hegel's system as a whole must be taken into account.

Another distinctive feature of Kervégan's book is that it affirms, more than many treatments of Hegel's position, the significance of "abstract law" (xii) -- what English-speaking interpreters normally call "abstract right" -- in the doctrine of objective spirit, where this means emphasizing not the limits of abstract right but the positive role it plays in the rational social order and hence in realizing practical freedom. Doing so, according to Kervégan, results in an understanding of objective spirit that affirms the central importance of law and combats a familiar picture of Hegel as an antilegalist, a view that remains popular to this day in certain strands of left-Hegelian Frankfurt School critical theory. Showing that Hegel is not merely a one-sided critic of law, with its abstractness and formality, is an interesting and worthwhile undertaking -- and is clearly correct as an interpretation of Hegel -- but Kervégan's points are somewhat obscured for English readers by the unfortunate translation throughout the book of Recht -- presumably droit in the French original -- as 'law'. The problem is that 'law' is a much narrower concept than Recht and is most naturally equated with Gesetz or loi; in other words, there is a good reason that abstraktes Recht is universally translated in English as 'abstract right' and 'law' is reserved for the narrower concept of Gesetz. (To add to the confusion, sometimes Recht (or droit) is translated here as 'right' (3, 52, 68, 70-1) without any indication of why in those instances it is not rendered as 'law'; the "Translator's Note" alludes to this confusing usage but does not explain it.)

An example of the problem this translation scheme poses is that, while "Abstract Right" clearly demonstrates Hegel's commitment to a scheme of individual (subjective) rights of the sort that liberals typically take to be the quintessence of freedom, it does not imply much about legalism -- an emphasis on codifying the principles of rational social life into laws -- as English speakers normally understand it. Hegel himself makes a similar point in distinguishing the much broader term Recht from the narrower term Gesetz, where the latter, nearly always qualified as positive law, is treated almost exclusively not in "Abstract Right" but in "Civil Society" under the specific rubric of Rechtspflege. This means that Kervégan's English book are required at every occurrence of 'law' to ask whether right or law is the intended concept. Both law and (abstract) rights are important to Hegel's vision of the rational social order, but English readers must know how to distinguish them, if they are to understand odd and apparently false statements such as "slavery is an 'absolute denial of law' in all times and places" (79).

With this caveat in mind, the innovative part of Kervégan's position on the importance of abstraktes Recht is contained in his claim that abstract right (or law?) is most important to Hegel because it "is indispensable for adequately thinking the concept of law in a way that accounts for social and political modernity and history as the history of the actualization and concretization of law" (1). Perhaps it is both abstract right and law that Kervégan has in mind in this claim -- what he sometimes refers to as the "legal order" and which appears to include both -- the basic point of which seems to be that a legal order is the very "paradigm of an institutional system" (12) and that, since the Philosophy of Right makes institutions central to the realization of all forms of freedom, the legal order is a "blueprint for objective freedom" (12) in all its guises.

In other words, even institutions that go beyond the abstractions of a legal order -- the institutions of Sittlichkeit, for example -- owe something central to their nature as institutions to the fundamental feature of abstract right and law, namely, that "it is a set of universal and objective determinations that, escaping the grasp of actors, . . . nevertheless appears as that which can provide a meaning, or at least a description, to their acts" (12). Law, in other words, is paradigmatic for social and political realizations of freedom in general because it represents a supra-subjective order -- a subject-less will or "spirit" -- that constitutes an objective order that functions as the necessary framework within which individual subjects are able to exercise their free agency. Thus, echoing Kant and Rousseau (and even Locke), Hegel endorses the view that rather than being a limitation on freedom, law is what makes freedom possible. Law is not only objective in this sense (a worldly realization of the freedom of subjects); it is also universal, and this feature of law serves to instill in those who are subject to it a recognition that the source of normative authority lies not in individual, subjective wills but in, as Rousseau would have it, a "general will." Although the universal wills that citizens and members of families must take on as their own are void of the abstractness and formality of law, they share with the latter the idea that, if freedom is to be realized, merely subjective wills must recognize the authority of a higher, "universal" will.

Clearly, then, Hegel is not well described as an antilegalist, but those who level this charge against him get something right about his position. As Kervégan points out, Hegel is an antilegalist in a rather weak form that is compatible with recognizing the fundamental importance of law (which many thinkers other than Hegel espouse as well): the legal order is not self-standing, insofar as it relies on nonlegal conditions for its efficacy, among these, of course, the institutions of Sittlichkeit, especially civil society. On this view, law is necessary and central to a free social order, but it is not the final word on how our social life must be constituted if we are to realize the full array of freedoms available to us.

The second two-thirds of the book are devoted to what follows "Abstract Right" in Hegel's text, and here Kervégan treats almost exclusively those parts of "Ethical Life" that deal with society and politics, namely, civil society and the (political) state, respectively. The virtual exclusion of the family from this discussion is perhaps easily understood: this sphere of objective spirit is the farthest removed from Kervégan's central concern with law (in the narrow sense, since the family is as much a part of Recht as their counterpart spheres). Moreover, providing accounts of morality and the family as comprehensive as his treatments of abstract right, civil society, and the state would have either made the book unwieldy or, worse, required the shortening of Kervégan's rich accounts of the domains in which law is most prominent. Much (but not all) of what Kervégan says about civil society and the state is generally familiar, which is probably to be expected, given the voluminous secondary literature already written on these topics. Perhaps the most illuminating feature of his treatment of civil society and the state for non-European readers is his expansive account of the historical background against which Hegel develops his own positions.

One aspect of this background is the history, beginning in the twelfth century, that lies behind Hegel's distinction between bourgeois and citizen (Bürger and Staatsbürger), an understanding of which is essential to comprehending and differentiating the freedom-realizing functions of the social and political spheres. Although most readers will have some notion of what this distinction consists in, Kervégan's scrupulous tracing of its development in Chapter 4 brings out interesting nuances that enrich our understanding of the distinction between the social and the political as intended by Hegel and that shed light on yet a third concept, the human being (Mensch), which he distinguishes from both. (Adding to the difficulty of distinguishing these concepts is the fact that two of them, Bürger and Mensch, have civil society as their home domain.) The generally unfamiliar point that this history reveals is that the meanings of these terms were still quiet fluid in Hegel's time and that "in giving precise and in some respects entirely new meaning to these notions, he illustrated a fundamental and new aspect of modern reality" (129).

Similarly enlightening are Kervégan's nuanced historical and conceptual explications of 'constitutional state' (Rechtsstaat) and 'rule of law' (confusingly translated here as 'State of Law' and 'state of law'), which he employs to argue, convincingly, that Hegel must be understood not as a proto-totalitarian but as a proponent and principal architect of a doctrine that continues even today to be a central pillar of Germans' political self-understanding, that of the Rechtsstaat. Yet another area in which Kervégan provides illuminating context for the doctrines of the Philosophy of Right is his chapter-long treatment of the complex parallels between Hegel's and de Tocqueville's views of democracy, in which he reveals both similarities and differences between their attitudes to popular sovereignty and democracy as a social condition (and not merely a political regime). Similarly excellent discussions of the historical and philosophical developments in the concepts of sovereignty and representation follow the chapter on de Tocqueville and illuminate the context in which Hegel's critical remarks on democracy and his endorsement of monarchy must be understood.

The final chapter is a highlight of the book, insofar as it attempts to draw the various strands of its complex argument together in order to address the question 'what is an ethical life?'. Here, too, however, Kervégan's position is obscured by translation choices that are confusing for English readers. Rather than rendering Sittlichkeit as the standard 'ethical life', the translators, at Kervégan's request, reserve that English term for sittliches Leben (as in the phrase 'an ethical life' in the question that leads off the chapter) and render Sittlichkeit with the not very informative term 'ethicality'. A further point of confusion is that both Sittlichkeit and 'ethicality' appear frequently throughout the English text; presumably readers are meant to understand the terms synonymously, but if this is the case, it is unclear why two terms, both of them artificial in English, are used for the same concept. Although it is reasonably clear what 'an ethical life' is supposed to mean (330), the reasons for using the puzzling term 'ethicality' are never explained, and readers are left with the impression that they may have failed to grasp what Kervégan takes to be a central concept of his interpretation.

The main task of the last chapter might be described as clarifying in what precise sense Hegel is to be considered an institutionalist since it obvious that institutions play a central role in objective spirit's overarching task of systematically realizing practical freedom. The topics at issue here harken back to chapter 10, on Morality, where Kervégan distances himself from Dieter Henrich's interpretation of Hegel's institutionalism, which, in Kervégan's words, "implies the unilateral subordination of individuals, their choices, and their behavior to the institutional conditions of their existence" (281-2). In its place Kervégan attributes to Hegel a weaker version of institutionalism that supposedly accommodates the rights of (individual) moral subjectivity more than Henrich's interpretation allows for. Weak institutionalism, according to Kervégan, regards institutional demands -- "the right of the world" -- not as placing restrictions on moral subjectivity but as supplying the conditions that the realization of moral subjectivity requires.

Kervégan deftly shows how Morality's demanding criteria for what constitutes an action that is truly "my own" are supposed to be met when subjects, appropriately formed, participate in the rational institutions of ethical life. When incorporated into ethical life, the "rights" of moral subjectivity appear to amount to the requirement that rational action be "the noncoerced adhesion of subjectivity to the norms of reason and the real human world" (303). Nevertheless, although realizing the freedom of moral subjectivity requires that social members' activity be noncoerced and expressions of their own understandings of the good, it remains true for Hegel -- this is what his institutionalism comes to -- that the realization of moral freedom "requires subjectivity to take on the requirements of the universal, that is, legal norms and the conditions of social and political life" (302). Presumably what distinguishes this interpretation of Hegel's institutionalism from Henrich's is that it does not envision the unilateral submission of individuals' actions to the requirements of institutions; the motivation for those actions come from within, as it were -- that is, from the subjects' own understanding of what the good requires of them. But if this interpretation gets Hegel's position right -- as I believe it does -- it is unlikely to allay all the worries of those who accuse Hegel of strong institutionalism. For it fails to address the concern, shared by many readers of Hegel, that his vision of the rational social order provides no room for -- accords no worth to nor guaranteed protected space for -- individuals' criticism or rejection of its institutions. Cause for concern might be detected even in some of Kervégan's formulations that make one wonder precisely what the difference between strong and weak institutionalism is, for example: "particular subjectivity only succeeds in [validating the objective rules of institutions] if . . . it recognizes the priority of objectivity, the 'right of the world', and accepts that relativization of its own aspirations" (334).

Kervégan's main point with respect to Sittlichkeit is what he calls the "institutional rootedness" (336) not only of collective practices but of individuality itself. This holds the key, I believe, to the difference he finds between Henrich's understanding of Sittlichkeit and his own. The potentially oppressive character of recognizing the priority of the objective rules of institutions is lessened when one recognizes that individuality itself is formed only within those institutions. The picture, then, is not one of an already existing individuality that must force itself into rigid institutional schemata that determine individuals' identities and actions, but rather one in which those identities first come into existence within the frameworks for action that institutions provide. Moreover, as Kervégan notes, these institutional schemata do not determine but only shape the identities and actions of those who live within them, which is why it makes sense to speak of them as living an ethical life rather than merely carrying out pre-specified social functions.

Finally, while Kervégan's book contains many insights that English readers will find helpful, one can also not help but be struck by the fact that it could have been written thirty or so years ago in almost the same form in which it appears now. A massive secondary literature has developed in both English and French in the last three decades, but this book takes almost no account of it. Kervégan's main interlocutors here are interpreters of earlier generations, including, most prominently, Rudolf Haym (who died in 1901). There is perhaps some value in abstracting from the accumulated mass of secondary literature in order to present Hegel's views more directly, but many (though not all) of Kervégan's claims will be familiar to those familiar with recent literature. Even for them, however, the book will be worth reading for his novel take on the role of law, his interesting account of Sittlichkeit, and for the enlightening historical background within which he situates many of Hegel's most important doctrines.