The Adventure of French Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Alain Badiou, The Adventure of French Philosophy, Bruno Bosteels (ed., tr.), Verso, 2012, 430pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781844677931.

Reviewed by Alan D. Schrift, Grinnell College


A general consensus has emerged that following the passing of Foucault, Deleuze, and Derrida, Alain Badiou remains, in the words of Slavoj Žižek that appear on this book's cover above the title, the one final "figure like Plato or Hegel [who] walks here among us!" As such, we have seen at least twenty-five titles by Badiou appear in English since 1999, with over a dozen in the last five years alone. Several of these are not translations of volumes by Badiou, but collections of essays compiled by people eager to bring Badiou's work to an English-speaking readership. The volume under review here is the latest of these, edited and translated by one of Badiou's most insightful interpreters and prolific translators, Bruno Bosteels. The organizing principle behind Bosteels's collection is straightforward: he seeks to present a selection of Badiou's writings, composed from 1967 to 2007, in which Badiou responds to and engages the philosophical work of his contemporaries. What results is a series of snapshots of how Badiou participates in and understands what, borrowing a notion from Frédéric Worms, Badiou's colleague at the Ecole Normale Supérieure, we might call the post-1960s moment in French philosophy.

The volume is organized in three parts. In the first, Bosteels brings together essays and talks in which Badiou engages several of the major figures in French philosophy over the past half century, including Louis Althusser, Georges Canguilhem, Jean-Paul Sartre, Jean-Luc Nancy, Michel Foucault, and Jacques Rancière. In the first two, from the 1970s -- a Maoist response to various leftist alternatives to the current situation in France, and a call to turn from the idealist Hegel of the Phenomenology of Spirit to the materialist Hegel of the Science of Logic -- Badiou is polemical. The remaining essays, from 1990-2006, are more judicious and generous. Most noteworthy here are an interesting essay that briefly yet insightfully surveys the entirety of Foucault's oeuvre, two essays that display deep admiration and affection for Jean-Luc Nancy, and a lengthy essay on Rancière that takes note of the longstanding arguments and disagreements between them -- dating back to their days as students of Althusser -- while trying both to pay homage to his work and to acknowledge where Badiou thinks he must follow a different path.

In the second part, which makes up well over half the volume, Bosteels has gathered eleven book reviews by Badiou, written between 1967 and 2003. Some of these are of works that will be familiar to many readers: a long and detailed review of Althusser's For Marx and Reading Capital, very critical reviews of Gilles Deleuze and Félix Guattari's Anti-Oedipus and Rhizome (the separately published essay that would eventually appear, in revised form, as the introduction to A Thousand Plateaus), and more complementary reviews of Deleuze's The Fold: Leibniz and the Baroque, Jean-François Lyotard's The Differend, and Paul Ricoeur's Memory, History, Forgetting. Others are of works not likely to be known to many English readers, including a critical review of Guy Lardreau and Christian Jambet's L'Ange: Ontologie de la révolution, a more positive review of Lardreau's La Véracité: Essai d'une philosophie négative, a glowing review of Barbara Cassin's L'Effet sophistique, and two reviews of works on Kant: Monique David-Ménard's La Folie dans la raison pure: Kant lecteur de Swedenborg, and Françoise Proust's Kant: Le ton de l'histoire. While it is not very common to anthologize a philosopher's reviews of the works of other philosophers, reading these makes clear the wisdom of Bosteels's decision. In some cases, as in the reviews of Althusser and of Deleuze's The Fold, we see how Badiou understands the work of someone he clearly regards to be a great philosopher, and there is much to learn about Althusser and Deleuze by reading these reviews. In others, like the reviews of Lyotard, Cassin, and the two books on Kant, Badiou fairly and generously surveys their contents but always returns in the end to the articulation of his own views on the topics discussed in those books. As a result, these reviews prove to be quite interesting insofar as they reveal much about the books being discussed as well as much about Badiou's own perspective on the issues addressed in them.

Following Bosteels's very helpful introduction, these two main parts are prefaced by an eponymous essay which is one of the few places where Badiou actually surveys the entirety of the trajectory of French philosophy in the second half of the twentieth century and offers his insightful account of what is distinctive about this particular moment in the history of philosophy. There is also a very short part three, in which we find two "notices": Badiou's memorial homage to Gilles Deleuze from Le Monde, and a defense of the work of sinologist François Jullien.

While it is impossible in a short review to discuss each of the twenty-two chapters, I would like to say a few words about some of them before concluding with some observations about the picture of Badiou that is presented by the volume as a whole. One of the things one realizes when reading this text is that when he chooses to, Badiou can be an enormously sensitive and insightful reader of the work of another. We see this, in fact, in many of the essays in part one and in several of the reviews included in the second part of the book. His format in these reviews is frequently the same: he offers a generous, often very complimentary, review of what he judges to be the central themes of the volume he is considering, and follows this by presenting, in the form of what he often calls "punctuations," a series of responses in which he shows either where the work departs from a compatible position that he would himself affirm or where it moves to a position he thinks is mistaken. But the tone here is always respectful, and the criticisms are offered as if in a discussion among friends. The two reviews of books on Kant are cases in point. As Badiou makes clear throughout, he is not a fan of Kant (cf. p. 290). But he can still appreciate that both Monique David-Ménard and Françoise Proust have each written a "very beautiful book" (270, 286). And in response to each, he chooses not to contradict but to counter-balance their ultimate conclusions by suggesting that, in different ways, each has highlighted finitude in a way that obscures a more fundamental generic infinity.

But this is not the only sort of review Badiou writes, and we see the full range of his authorial voice in his treatment of Deleuze. In the earlier reviews of Anti-Oedipus and Rhizome (both 1977), there is little but scorn for the underlying philosophy and politics in Deleuze and Guattari's work. In the former, which is less a review than, as the subtitle indicates, notes in the margin of Anti-Oedipus, Deleuze and Guattari are castigated for being "theoreticians of desire" who offer little more than "anti-dialectical moralism" (178). At best, their analysis affirms the disaffected and self-serving politics of petit bourgeois youth; at worst, they are the "hateful adversaries of all organized revolutionary politics" (188). This attack continues into the review of Rhizome, titled provocatively enough "The Fascism of the Potato," where things get very personal. Deleuze and Guattari are "the cunning monkeys of multiplicities, the heads of the anti-Marxist troupe" (193); since they are not illiterate, "We will thus take them to be crooks [who] take their readers to be morons" (194). At the basis of this attack is the fact that "they have recognized in the dialectic their true adversary" (195). As such, they stand as "pre-fascist ideologues" (201).

When reading these remarks today, I must wonder if Badiou is at all embarrassed by the tone of his polemic. For there is at bottom a philosophical issue at work here, namely, whether one must follow the Marxist dialectical principle that "One divides into two" or whether one should reject this dialectical binarism and offer in place of the One a multiplicity. While Badiou might be correct in diagnosing Deleuze's popularity as a function of his "being the bard of the multiple in revolt against the bourgeois One" (195), revelations about Mao and Maoism in the years since this review was written make Badiou's unquestioning affirmation of Maoism and the Cultural Revolution problematic, to say the least. When reading Sartre's Anti-Semite and Jew today, we see that much of his analysis still holds for contemporary anti-Semitism, racism, and homophobia, but Sartre's comment that "we find scarcely any anti-Semitism amongst workers" is laughable. Badiou's faith in the revolutionary potential of the "One of the proletariat" may strike some readers as equally risible.

After reading these reviews, and also being familiar with Badiou's book-length criticism in Deleuze: The Clamor of Being (1988), his 1989 review of Deleuze's The Fold: Leibniz and the Baroque was a shock. Gone is the polemic and over-the-top nastiness. And whether or not this is, as Bosteels suggests, a sobered-up version "of the same polemics that roused his fury a decade earlier" (xlv), it stands as a remarkable reading of a "rare and admirable book [that] offers us a vision and a conception of our world" (242). Deleuze here is described as "a perfect reader" whose exposition not only teaches us much about Leibniz but, more importantly, teaches us why "we moderns remain Leibnizian" (241). What then follows are twenty pages in which Badiou the pedagogue lays out the major components of what I would call the Leibniz-Deleuze assemblage: the multiple and organicity, the event and singularity, the subject and interiority, nature and truth. The review concludes, as do most of the others, with five punctuations in which he does not try to refute Deleuze's positions but seeks instead to explain how, by making "the other ontological choice -- that of subtraction, of the empty set, and of the matheme" -- rather than Deleuze's choice of the fold and the "inexhaustible fullness of the world" (261), Badiou arrives at a different conceptualization of these same components, and in the process suggests to the reader the remarkable conclusion that when it comes to philosophy, there is between himself and Deleuze both an infinite distance and an unfathomable proximity.

Bosteels suggests in his introduction, and I would agree, that one finds running through all of the essays five "categorial oppositions" (xii) that Badiou highlights as defining the current moment in contemporary French philosophy: life or concept, continuity or discontinuity, finitude or infinity, critique or dialectic, and leftism or Maoism. While these five oppositions appear in various forms throughout these essays, the latter two dominate the earlier essays, while the former three, and perhaps most consistently the opposition between finitude and infinity, dominate the essays of the last two decades. Badiou also changes from the early to the late essays. In the earlier ones, he appears as much a Maoist polemicist as a philosopher. In the later essays, what comes forward is the thinking of an elder statesmen and pedagogue. Some readers may miss the former, the angry young firebrand who proclaims "There is only one great philosopher of our time: Mao Zedong" (1). I much prefer the latter as an informative guide through the adventure of French philosophy.