The Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature

Placeholder book cover

Malcolm Budd, The Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature, Oxford, 2003, 180pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199259658.

Reviewed by Fiona Hughes, University of Essex


This book comprises four essays, each based on previously published articles and capable of being read independently, yet as a whole they constitute a substantial study of the aesthetics of nature. The book has the virtue of serving as an introduction to the uninitiated while deepening the interest of the converted and will be of interest to anyone working in the field of aesthetics. Budd is committed to a catholic perspective allowing for the aesthetic appreciation of nature, art, sport, juggling and much else. [p. 15] But his focus in this book is exclusively on the first of these. He dates a renaissance in the topic to the publication in 1966 of Ronald Hepburn’s highly influential ``Contemporary Aesthetics and the Neglect of Natural Beauty’, which Budd suggests reversed the priority of artistic over natural beauty prevailing since Hegel. Not surprisingly, given this genealogy, Hegel’s predecessor, Kant, for whom natural beauty was paradigmatic, figures as an important point of reference for Budd’s studies.

The approach is analytical and critical in style. Budd’s aims are descriptive in that he believes that any successful theory will ‘chime in with’ our experience. His preference is for a theory that would be ‘neutral as to the relative importance or priority of art and nature within the field of the aesthetic’. [p. 13] These preferences set the scene for investigations that are rigorous and unpolemical. However, an emphasis on the shortcomings in theories under investigation can be limiting, especially when it comes to seeing the broader picture. In particular, Budd displays a lack of sympathy for Kant’s systematic commitments.

Essay 1 is concerned with what it is to aesthetically appreciate ‘nature as nature’, the Leitmotiv of the book as a whole. In Essay 2 Budd gives an extended, although necessarily selective, reading of Kant’s aesthetics of nature in the Critique of Judgment, focusing on Kant’s account of natural beauty, the relationship of the latter to morality and the sublime in nature. Essay 3 takes issue with those aesthetic theories for which art is the dominant paradigm, even for an aesthetics of nature. Budd then turns to ‘positive aesthetics’, for which everything in unmanipulated nature has a positive aesthetic value. In particular he considers arguments put forward by Allen Carlson, whose environmentally oriented aesthetics stands in contrast to his own account. In Essay 4 Budd gives a helpful, though selective overview of trends in the literature since Hepburn’s article. Carlson figures once again as a major interlocutor, particularly with reference to the way in which knowledge plays a role in aesthetic appreciation. While Carlson believes that Kendall Walton’s distinction between apparent and real properties of artworks can be applied to nature in so far as the latter is capable of being ‘determined by the right categories’, Budd convincingly questions whether such categories could ever be established. His conclusion is that, because of the freedom left to the observer in the face of the variability or ‘relativity’ of phenomena, ‘there is no such thing as the appropriate foci of aesthetic significance in the natural environment or the appropriate boundaries of the setting’[p. 147].

In Essay 1 Budd distinguishes between a weak and a strong form of the aesthetic appreciation of ‘nature as nature’. [pp. 9-10] The weak or ‘external’ form covers those cases where a natural thing or event is liked either not in virtue of being an artwork or in virtue of not being an artwork. Budd calls the first the ‘non-artistic’ and the second the ‘anti-artistic’ version. The strong or ‘internal’ form is only the case when the liking arises in virtue of something being natural. In other words, the natural status of the object or event – Budd uses the neutral term ‘item’ – constitutes a necessary element of one’s appreciation. This is Budd’s own position, which he seeks to elaborate and then apply throughout the rest of the book. He sums it up as:

the idea of a response to a natural item, grounded on its naturalness—on its being a part of nature or on its being a specific kind of natural item—focused on its elements or aspects as structured or interrelated in the item, the item being experienced as intrinsically rewarding, unrewarding, or displeasing, the hedonic character of the reaction being ‘disinterested’.[p.16]

Aesthetic appreciation of ‘nature as nature’ entails an awareness of the object or event falling under the concept of nature and this knowledge is constitutive of our liking for it.

The idea of liking ‘nature as nature’ marks an important difference between Budd and Kant, which can be drawn out by contrasting the ways in which they characterize aesthetic appreciation as ‘free’. Whereas, as we have seen, for Budd the freedom of the spectator arises from the diversity of categories under which nature could be taken up, for Kant the freedom of aesthetic judgment implies that it is not determined by a concept. Budd is, however, right to insist that Kant’s account does not entail that ‘the object must be experienced without its being experienced as falling under a concept (of that natural kind)’. [p. 29] Kant does not insist that we are unaware of the object’s natural kind in finding it aesthetically pleasing, but only that a concept does not determine the pleasure. Budd holds that, nevertheless, Kant has no account of aesthetic appreciation of ‘nature as nature’, in that he insists that when I like something aesthetically, I ‘abstract’ from any empirical concept of it. [p. 29] This would seem to rule out the possibility that my liking could be ‘grounded on its naturalness’ as Budd’s model requires, for although in another frame of mind I know the object to be natural, this does not contribute to my aesthetic appreciation of it.

It is arguable that Kant concedes a greater role to our awareness of the natural status of an aesthetically appreciated object than Budd’s talk of ‘abstraction’ suggests. Paradoxically, we can draw this out from Kant’s claim that the beautiful in nature looks as if it were art, whereas the beautiful in art looks as if it were nature. [Critique of Judgement AA 306] Budd rejects positions such as Savile’s and Wollheim’s that regard artworks as paradigmatic for our aesthetic appreciation of natural objects. Without entering into an assessment of his response to either (his account of the latter is very brief), I would like to suggest that there is more to Kant’s chiasmic statement than meets the eye. Kant’s suggestion is surely that the natural thing, recognized as natural, is beautiful in so far as it mimics art. But in what sense does it do so? The aesthetically pleasing natural object bears a certain structural similarity to an artwork in so far as it displays purposiveness of form. The artwork, conversely, is only beautiful in so far as, while we are aware that it is an artwork, it nevertheless mimics the purposeless or intention-free appearance of nature. The beautiful hovers between purpose and purposelessness and this indeterminate status is only possible in so far as a natural object mimics art or vice versa. If this is right then there is a sense in which the awareness of the object’s natural status is a necessary condition of, while not determining or engendering, our aesthetic appreciation of it.

Repeatedly Budd argues against the idea that aesthetic appreciation of nature involves seeing the latter as art. An early statement of this central commitment comes when he says that his theme is ‘nature as nature and not as art (or artefact)’ [p. 5]. However there is a distinction between viewing nature as art in a reductive sense and the subjunctive mood of the ‘as if’. Nature can be viewed as if it were art, without in any sense reducing nature to art. Admittedly, conceding this distinction to Kant does not result in an aesthetics of ‘nature as nature’ in Budd’s terms. But this is not because Kant ‘abstracts’ from the natural status of the aesthetic object, but rather because its being natural is not sufficient for it to count as aesthetic. If it is to qualify as such, it must be recognized as nature and yet at the same time mimic art. To say that nature is seen as if it were art is strictly to say that it is not possible to determine the scene or thing under a concept because of the playful or expansive frame of mind it invites in our response to it.

There is undoubtedly a disagreement between Kant and Budd in so far as the latter holds that ‘relevant knowledge’ makes possible aesthetic responses that would otherwise be impossible. [p. 20] The knowledge now in question is not simply the awareness that the object or event is natural, but rather that further determinations play a role in our aesthetic appreciation of it. In principle, Kant need not have excluded the possibility that knowledge can enhance our aesthetic appreciation, just as he concedes an ancillary role to charm. But he did not entertain such a possibility, blinded perhaps by the need to exclude knowledge as the determining ground of aesthetic pleasure. While Budd denies that knowledge necessarily leads to heightened aesthetic pleasure, he insists that it can do so. The question that arises is whether knowledge is capable not only of ‘transform[ing] one’s aesthetic experience of nature’ [p. 20], but also of engendering it. Budd seems to be on firmer ground in the former case, but he also says the sublime can be ‘produced’ by the addition of knowledge to perception. [p. 22] As he makes no distinction between the sublime and aesthetic response in general here, we must conclude that this would hold for any aesthetic experience. While knowledge is not a necessary condition of aesthetic pleasure, it can, according to Budd, be a sufficient condition. Yet this claim would require a deeper analysis of the role played by knowledge in the internal dynamics of aesthetic appreciation.

Importantly not all knowledge is aesthetically relevant for Budd. Only that which ‘integrate[s] with the perception in such a manner as to generate a new perceptual-cum-imaginative content of experience’ counts. [my emphasis. p. 22] This distinction is important for the distance at which Budd stands to Carlson’s ‘natural environmental model’ of aesthetics of nature, discussed in Essays 3 and 4. Whereas Carlson insists that common sense or natural-scientific knowledge of nature is essential to the aesthetic appreciation of nature, Budd asks how we can delimit the knowledge that is aesthetically relevant. [p. 136] Whereas Carlson’s account threatens to deaden aesthetic affect under a burden of knowledge, Budd’s focus on the emergence of new perceptions through the intermediary of imagination discovers a criterion of aesthetic relevance for knowledge. Budd does not much develop this idea beyond supplying an extended range of examples in Essay 1, nor does he do so in the critical reconstructive discussion of Essay 4. Nevertheless it is one of the most valuable ideas he offers and reveals a place for knowledge in aesthetics, which it would be possible to combine with the Kantian insight that the latter is not reducible to cognitive, moral or other, including environmental, interests. This insight could have been developed into an account of how different orientations overlap in the aesthetic case, without their determining it. This could allow us to see how aesthetic freedom fosters our capacity not only for cognitive open-mindedness, but also for moral impartiality.

However such a development of his account of the generative role of knowledge would almost certainly go against Budd’s instincts. In Essay II he reveals himself to be skeptical about Kant’s systematic aspirations. While there is much in his reading of Kant that is of great value, two points are particularly telling. Firstly, Budd is unconvinced by Kant’s attempt to link aesthetic judgment to morality through their shared formal status. With characteristic incisiveness, he points out the distinction between the formal status of the categorical imperative that concerns any maxim or principle of action’s ‘accordance or conflict with the requirement of willed universality’ and ‘the form of a beautiful object’ that is nothing other than ‘the structure of its elements’. [p. 57] The transition from aesthetics to morality is unsuccessful because ‘the existence of natural beauty … reveals only that nature is hospitable to the aesthetic exercise of our cognitive powers’. It does not concern ‘our ability to realize our moral ends’. [pp. 56-7] The second issue is that of Kant’s much criticized use of a psychological idiom, in that he tries to explain the possibility of knowledge and aesthetic appreciation through a ‘murky’ [p. 31] investigation of mental faculties. Budd says that this amounts either to a ‘picturesque redescription of the experience’ or ‘a priori speculation about psychological processes’. In the first case it is ‘unenlightening’, while in the second ‘it needs to be replaced by an empirically well-founded account’. [p. 34] These two criticisms are related, for it is by means of faculty theory that Kant attempts to show the systematic connection between aesthetics, morality and cognition.

Kant’s reason for writing a third critique was not simply the discovery of a distinct species of aesthetic judgment, but the coincidence of this event with the possibility of revealing a bridge between cognition and morality, thus completing the critical system. While Budd is right that the formal status of aesthetic judgment and of morality are distinct from one another, it would be possible to show how they are linked within a systematic account of Kant’s formalism. I can only sketch what would be an intricate argument. The form of an object or the ‘structure of its elements’ invites a formal judgment in which the imagination is in harmony with the understanding without determination by an empirical or categorial rule. We are able to give the rule to ourselves (this counts as ‘heautonomy’), even though in response to something given to us in experience. This is a first step to revealing our capacity for the autonomous use of reason. It is strictly a preparation or propadeutic for the moral ability to judge according to the form of the moral law. Whereas it would be impossible to move directly from the form of the aesthetic object to the form of the moral law, as Budd rightly says, the move is rather from the form of aesthetic judgment to that of action based on a formal principle. The freedom of mind both imply is the ground of the possibility for the transition from aesthetics to morality. As aesthetics is based on the subjective conditions of cognition, the giant step from cognition to morality becomes, at least in principle, possible.