The Aesthetic Illusion in Literature and the Arts

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Tomáš Koblížek (ed.), The Aesthetic Illusion in Literature and the Arts, Bloomsbury, 2017, 305pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350032583.

Reviewed by Jason Leddington, Bucknell University


This methodologically-diverse collection explores our relationship to the contents of representational artifacts such as novels, films, paintings, and sculptures. It focuses on a familiar and important but (at least by philosophers) little-studied phenomenon: namely, that such works can provide highly-absorbed, "immersive" experiences of the worlds that they represent. The collection takes its orientation toward this phenomenon from literary theorist Werner Wolf, whose regimentation of the term 'aesthetic illusion' has been influential in literary and media studies. While only a few of the essays directly engage Wolf's work, they all share a concern with how we relate to represented worlds, and, in particular, with ideas such as immersion and illusion.

The essays are based on talks delivered in 2015 at the 10th Prague Interpretation Colloquium hosted by the Department of Analytic Philosophy at the Institute of Philosophy at the Czech Academy of Sciences. The Colloquium is unusual in regularly featuring analytic philosophers alongside literary and media theorists. Accordingly, while roughly one-third of the essays are by philosophers working in the analytic tradition, most of the others are by scholars in literary and media studies.

A multi-disciplinary volume of essays is not without precedent in philosophy of art. Still, we can hope that the appearance of this collection -- and the persistence of the Colloquium itself -- signals continued rapprochement between literary and media studies and analytic philosophy. If, as Tomáš Koblížek explains in his introduction, literary criticism is no longer, as it was a "half-century ago, . . . dominated by structural analysis" at a remove from the "'naïve experience' of ordinary readers," then literary theorists have much to discuss with philosophers of art and good reason to explore relevant work in aesthetics, philosophy of mind, and empirical psychology (1-2). At the same time, philosophers of art have perhaps never more highly valued the close study of particular works and the means by which they achieve their effects. So, robust interdisciplinary exchange would have obvious value.

That said, only a few of the essays work substantively across disciplinary lines (see, for instance, the contributions from Marco Caracciolo, Göran Rossholm, and Josep E. Corbí); in most cases, traditional boundaries remain firmly in place. Consider the collection's opening -- and crowning -- essay, by Wolf himself. Its bibliography lists more than 70 works, but only one is a (relatively) recent work of analytic philosophy: Kendall Walton's Mimesis as Make-Believe (1990) -- which, while cited for support, is never actually discussed. (This despite the fact that, as I discuss below, Wolf's ideas stand to benefit immensely from engagement with such work.) Notably, Walton, too, sticks to familiar terrain in his contribution to a 2013 Wolf-edited volume, where he leaves "to readers the complicated but no doubt fascinating task" of exploring the relationship between ideas such as aesthetic illusion and immersion and Walton's own hobbyhorse: the idea of participation in games of make-believe (Walton 2013, 129). Again, then, there is work to be done, whether in bridging historically alienated disciplines or in breaking new conceptual ground. Here, briefly, are three areas of analytic philosophy ripe for it.

First, and most obviously, building on debates about the relationships between belief, pretense, and imagination as well as the role of desire in imaginative contexts, a few analytic philosophers have recently turned their attention directly to phenomena such as "immersion" and "imaginative transportation" (see Kampa (2017); Chasid (2017); Schellenberg (2013); and Doggett and Egan (2007)). However, as you might expect, this has been done without any engagement or apparent familiarity with work by Wolf and other literary and media theorists.

Second, philosophical debates about pretense, imagination, desire, etc., have been conducted alongside and intertwined with debates about emotional responses to fiction. Immersion is clearly relevant to many such responses. Here is Walton:

We don't just observe fictional worlds from without. We live in them . . . together with Anna Karenina and . . . the others, sharing their joys and sorrows. . . . True, these worlds are merely fictional, and we are well aware that they are. But from inside they seem actual. . . . It is this experience that underlies much of the fascination representations have for us and their power over us. (1990, 273)

Yet the idea of seeming-actual-from-the-inside tends to get sidelined in discussions of our emotional responses to fiction, thanks, no doubt, to association with an array of widely-rejected "illusionist . . . views [that] maintain that when we engage emotionally with fictional characters and situations, we temporarily cease to represent them as imaginary, instead representing them . . . to be real" (Gendler 2018, 5.3). However, rejecting such views should not lead us to discount the explanatory and aesthetic value of immersive experience.

Third, philosophical work on particular art forms and genres might be a rich source of insight into the nature of immersive experience. Indeed, it is no surprise that the phenomenology of our most powerfully-immersive art form -- traditional narrative film -- should already have attracted a good deal of philosophical attention (see Currie (1995); Hopkins (2008, 2010); Wilson (2012); and contributions to Thomson-Jones (2016)). Moreover, the nature and character of immersive experiences might vary across types of representations. In this case, thinking in general terms about phenomena such as "immersion" and "aesthetic illusion" might obscure differences between how we engage with -- and are engaged by -- various media. I'll say more about this below.

The collection is divided into four parts: 1. Illusion and Media; 2. Illusion and the Mind; 3. Illusive Worlds; and 4. Questioning Illusion. My remarks will focus on Wolf's notion of aesthetic illusion which he presents in the essay that opens part one. In the process, I'll draw connections to other contributions, and I'll close by identifying other essays that I think will be of greatest interest to philosophers.

Wolf's essay is entitled "Aesthetic Illusions(s)? Toward a Media-Conscious Theory of Media-Elicited Immersion as a Transmedial Phenomenon." It aims to argue that "the imaginative activities elicited by the various media appear to be sufficiently similar to warrant the concept of one aesthetic illusion across media rather than a plurality of aesthetic illusions" (29). There's a great deal of interest here, even if Wolf's argument is ultimately unsuccessful.

Here is his definition of aesthetic illusion:

Aesthetic illusion is a basically pleasurable mental state that frequently emerges during the reception of representational texts (and, as will be shown in the following, also non-textual artefacts, or performances). These representations may be fictional or factual, narrative or descriptive. . . . Aesthetic illusion consists primarily of a feeling, with variable intensity, of being imaginatively and emotionally immersed in a represented world and of experiencing this world as a presence (even if it is a narrative of the past) in an as-if mode, that is, in a way similar (but not identical) to real life. At the same time, however, this impression of immersion is counterbalanced by a latent rational distance resulting from a culturally-acquired metareferential (media-)awareness of the difference between representation and reality. (32)

I have a lot to say about this, but I'll confine myself to three comments. As we'll see, the main problem is that Wolf is committed to a strong version of a view that, as mentioned above, philosophers widely reject: an "illusionist" conception of our engagement with representational artifacts.

First, what exactly does it mean to experience the represented world "as a presence . . . in an as-if mode, that is, in a way similar (but not identical) to real life?" After all, every experience is "in a way similar (but not identical) to" every other experience. So, the question is: what are the relevant dimensions of similarity? What Wolf says here is evocative, but in the end disappointingly vague. He writes of "a mainly intuitive mental simulation" involving

emotions as well as sensory impressions and quasi-perceptions (including, but not restricted to, visual imagination), and also corporeal reactions, but equally reason or cognition to the extent that a certain rationality is required to make sense of the represented world. (33)

This is about as deep as the account gets, and it's one of the main places that Wolf's ideas would benefit from engagement with recent analytic philosophy -- for instance, with work on imagination and mental imagery. Moreover, the idea that immersion in a represented world involves "mental simulation" needs defense and receives none. Perhaps it is plausible that, in reading certain novels, the reader must imaginatively "construct" a world (cf. Weisberg 2016). But this is much less plausible vis-à-vis our experiences of representational paintings, movies, theatrical performances, and even sculptures. Part of the point of such representations is to make their representational contents available for visual inspection. Arguably, then, there's no need for the audience to imaginatively construct another, internal representation of the relevant world (cf. 35). One (external) representation is enough.

Second, Wolf claims that the "impression of immersion is counterbalanced by a latent rational distance resulting from a culturally-acquired metareferential (media-)awareness of the difference between representation and reality." But the idea that our awareness of the fact that "the illusion-inducing artefact is a mere representation" is just a "latent rational awareness" that operates "in the background" is phenomenologically inaccurate. We generally experience representational artifacts as representations. In other words, our awareness of them as such is not latent, but perceptual. Wolf's mistake, I think, is to take the experience of trompe l'œil as a general model for immersion in representational works (and not just visual ones!) (cf. 58). Trompe l'œil paintings create the visual impression that what is merely represented is actually present. In this case, we may have to remind ourselves (maintain a "latent rational awareness") that they are mere representations. But this is certainly not how we experience texts, and it is a basic lesson of philosophical reflection on depiction that, no matter how immersed we are, this is not how we experience most pictures, whether static or moving (Wollheim 1980; Hopkins 2010). Indeed, just these points are made by Enrico Terrone in his contribution on the phenomenology of film (108-9); but while he presents them as an "unpacking" of Wolf's ideas, I don't think that they're points Wolf can easily accommodate. This is because he conceives of immersion in resolutely internalist fashion, as a kind of "mental simulation" on a "mental 'screen'" (34). On this view, the experience of immersion is constituted independently of the representational artifact, which functions merely as a "trigger" (34). The result is that immersive experiences become something like self-conscious object-induced hallucinations -- and Wolf admits as much: "Aesthetic illusion is distinguished from real-life hallucinations and dreams, which do not require the presence of actual objects of perception, in that it is induced by the perception of really existing representations" (32). But again: this not only fails to capture the nature of (even highly-absorbed) pictorial experience (including, I think, that of most sculptures), it is implausible as a general account of immersion in text-based narratives (cf. pp. 292-3 of Anders Pettersson's, "Skeptical Reflections on the Concept of Aesthetic Illusion," to which I return below).

Third, these reflections problematize Wolf's argument for the media-independence of aesthetic illusion as part of a general account of immersive experience in representational works. If aesthetic illusion is constituted independently of the specific nature of the representational artifact, then, to establish his point, he has to show only that representations in different media can serve as "triggers" for the relevant sort of subjective experience. On the one hand, this is easy: just about anything can trigger anything else, under the right conditions. To be fair, though, Wolf's argument is sensitive to the different means by which distinct media facilitate experiences of immersion. The trouble is that, since he thinks of immersion from the start as a kind of object-triggered self-conscious hallucination, he is led to say some very implausible things about what those experiences are like. (See, for instance, his discussion of film on p. 53 and his discussion of painting on p. 57.) It's hard not to conclude that particular cases are being forced to fit a general picture that, in the end, obscures rather than illuminates the phenomena in question. One alternative, of course, is to abandon the idea of giving a substantive media-independent account of immersion in representational works.

Overall, I think that Wolf -- and more than a few participants in the immersion debate -- have been misled by a poorly-framed question. If we ask about immersion in a represented world, two things tend to happen. First, the medium is relegated to secondary status: it becomes a mere means, a mode of "transportation" to the represented world. Second, the represented world is reified: it becomes a "place" (a "possible world") to which we travel, and the task is to understand its nature and that of our relationship to it. Thus "fictional worlds theory" is born (e.g., Ryan 2001). But the right thing to say is that the "world" represented in a representational work is just this world, the world, which is, after all, the only world. This very point is nicely made in perhaps the strongest contribution, Petr Kot'átko's "Fiction, Illusion, Reality, and Radical Narration," which develops a broadly Kripkean approach to singular reference in fictional texts. Kot'átko reminds us of Kripke's warning against confusions that might arise from speaking of "possible worlds," confusions we might avoid by speaking instead about "possible states or histories of the world" (Kripke 1980, 18). Quite so. And as Kot'átko notes, "this restrained terminology does not support the illusion of traveling from world to world, apparently involved in interpreting fiction. On the contrary, it pins the interpretative acts down to earth, that is, to the actual world" (202). (Compare Stacie Friend: "[I]n reading we take works of fiction, like works of non-fiction, to be about the real world -- even if they invite us to imagine the world to be different from how it actually is" (2017, 41).) The lesson? Stop treating the (metaphorical) phrase "immersion in (or transportation to) a represented world" as a guide to a theoretical project. Our object of study should be immersion in works, not worlds. And since immersion in a work essentially involves the work itself, it becomes impossible to reflect on immersion independently of the particular ways in which particular media (and ultimately, particular works) engage our attention. Such an externalist, medium-relative conception of immersion offers a stark contrast to Wolf's thoroughly internalist notion of aesthetic illusion.

So far, I've mentioned some ways in which other contributors (Terrone and Kot'átko, especially) point toward ways of thinking about immersion that don't fit the Wolfian model. However, such possibilities are explored more directly in the final part of the collection, "Questioning Illusion." The essays of greatest interest here, by Emily T. Troscianko and Pettersson, challenge the notion of aesthetic illusion on numerous fronts, some of which closely parallel the concerns I voice above; and while they are intended primarily as responses to Wolf, they will be of value to any researcher interested in the phenomenon of immersion. Troscianko dedicates 15 pages to a critique of Wolf's handling of concepts such as illusion, aesthetic, distance, and mental screen before canvassing some empirical data on how readers describe their reading experiences. Her conclusion: when it comes theories of immersive reading, the data encourage us to "reject" the term 'aesthetic illusion' in favor of 'transportation' (268). (However, as I mention above, the latter comes with its own theoretical dangers.) On the other hand, Pettersson claims that "aesthetic illusion is too broad a category to function well" in a milieu in which "the study of how recipients interact with art is becoming more and more differentiated and fine-grained" (290). He convincingly argues that "aesthetic illusion" lumps together "importantly different phenomena": namely, the relational, externalist phenomenon of "absorbed attention to a representation" and the purely internal phenomenon of "vivid imagining of representational content" (294). Since we can (and very often do!) have the former without the latter, they deserve separate theoretical treatment; but the term 'aesthetic illusion' encourages us to conflate them, so we should ditch it. I agree.

Finally, what of the other essays? I've already mentioned two of the three (for me) highlights: Kot'átko's chapter and Terrone's "Neither Here nor There, but Now: Film Experience and the Aesthetic Illusion." Both engage substantively with the work of Currie, and they both make interesting and compelling arguments. Kot'átko offers his Kripkean view of singular terms in response to Currie's worry that, if we treat 'Sherlock Holmes' as a proper name, then we have to interpret it as referring -- per impossibile -- to a particular possible person (2003). Meanwhile, Terrone argues contra Currie (1995, 200) that, while we do not perceive events depicted by film as taking place in front of us, we do perceive them as happening now; in other words, films give us a "sense of (temporal) presentness without a corresponding sense of (spatial) presence (cf. Dokic 2012)" (109). My third personal highlight is Caracciolo's "Reading for the Mind: Aesthetic Illusion, Fictional Characters, and the Role of Interpretation," which follows Murray Smith (2011) in applying Wollheim's notion of twofoldness to our engagement with representations of fictional characters. Just as we cannot easily stop seeing the person in the picture, so we cannot easily "stop reading characters through a mentalistic framework" (123). What Caracciolo has to say here is illuminating. Notably, his essay also includes nuanced discussion of the variety of reasons we have to value this kind of engagement with character-representations.

The last word? Despite -- and in some cases, because of -- its flaws, this collection constitutes a valuable contribution to the developing philosophical literature on immersion. If you're interested in the topic, or in closely-related issues such as "fictional worlds," it should be on your reading list.


Chasid, Alon. 2017. "Imaginative Content, Design-Assumptions and Immersion." Review of Philosophy and Psychology 8 (2): 259-72. 

Currie, Gregory. 1995. Image and Mind: Film, Philosophy and Cognitive Science. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

———. 2003. "Characters and Contingency." Dialectica 57 (2): 137-48.

Doggett, Tyler, and Andy Egan. 2007. "Wanting Things You Don't Want: The Case for an Imaginative Analogue of Desire." Philosopher's Imprint 7 (9): 1-17.

Dokic, Jérôme. 2012. "Pictures in the Flesh: Presence and Appearance in Pictorial Experience." The British Journal of Aesthetics 52 (4): 391-405. 

Friend, Stacie. 2017. "The Real Foundation of Fictional Worlds." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 95 (1): 29-42.

Gendler, Tamar. 2018. "Imagination." Edited by Edward N Zalta. Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Hopkins, Robert. 2008. "What Do We See in Film?" The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 66 (2): 149-159.

———. 2010. "Moving Because Pictures? Illusion and the Emotional Power of Film." Midwest Studies In Philosophy 34 (1): 200-218.

Kampa, Samuel. 2017. "Imaginative Transportation." Australasian Journal of Philosophy, October, 1-14. 

Kripke, Saul A. 1980. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.

Ryan, Marie-Laure. 2001. Narrative as Virtual Reality: Immersion and Interactivity in Literature and Electronic Media. Parallax. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press.

Schellenberg, Susanna. 2013. "Belief and Desire in Imagination and Immersion." The Journal of Philosophy, 497-517.

Smith, Murray. 2011. "On the Twofoldness of Character." New Literary History 42 (2): 277-94.

Thomson-Jones, Katherine, ed. 2016. Current Controversies in Philosophy of Film. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Walton, Kendall L. 1990. Mimesis as Make-Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

———. 2013. "Pictures and Hobby Horses: Make-Believe beyond Childhood." In Immersion and Distance: Aesthetic Illusion in Literature and Other Media, edited by Werner Wolf, Walter Bernhart, and Andreas Mahler, 113-130. Amsterdam: Rodopi.

Weisberg, Deena Skolnick. 2016. "How Fictional Worlds Are Created: Creating Fictional Worlds." Philosophy Compass 11 (8): 462-70. 

Wilson, George M. 2012. Seeing Fictions in Film. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wollheim, Richard. 1980. "Seeing-as, Seeing-in, and Pictorial Representation." In Art and Its Objects, 2nd ed., 205-226. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.