The Aesthetic Paths of Philosophy: Presentation in Kant, Heidegger, Lacoue-Labarthe, and Nancy

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Alison Ross, The Aesthetic Paths of Philosophy: Presentation in Kant, Heidegger, Lacoue-Labarthe, and Nancy, Stanford University Press, 2007, 231pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804754880.

Reviewed by Jason M. Wirth, Seattle University


Alison Ross has written a fascinating and commendable study in which she pursues the "general claim that the Kantian topic of presentation is an enduring topic within contemporary European thought" (11). Not only does this theme "endure," not only does it place "some of the problems treated in their work in a new light" (11), that is, not only does it recur often in some of the major thinkers in this tradition (Ross details its importance in the work of Kant, Heidegger, Lacoue-Labarthe, and Nancy) without it being fully appreciated, but it also plays a fundamental role in the work of these thinkers.

Although the last point is not always argued explicitly and extensively in Ross' study, it is clearly implied, allowing her text to be read on the following levels. 1) It traces and develops an underappreciated but critical theme that develops in Kant's philosophy, and then is radicalized in Heidegger, and then pursued as a decisive issue in the work of Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy, two thinkers whose writings inhabit expansively the space opened up by Heidegger. 2) If one takes these thinkers seriously, the lens of presentation provides an important perspective through which to enter their thinking. 3) It also invites sympathetic readers to think more carefully and fundamentally about how we think when we think philosophically. The question of presentation is not only a philosophical theme among possible philosophical themes, but rather it exposes thinking to what Heidegger once called "the other beginning" of philosophy. In this sense, presentation is not just a problem for philosophy but also the problem of philosophy. It is a reconsideration of die Sache des Denkens, what thinking thinks from and towards.

Ross worries that an emphasis on the problem of expression may lead to an unhealthy case of "path dependency" (167), despite, for example, Nancy's stated intention that he is using the question of presentation "in order to go elsewhere, towards other words" (166). The danger, if I take Ross' point correctly, lies in the reduction of thinking into an interminable preoccupation with its enabling conditions, and hence an obfuscation of all other paths for "there is no end to the problem of presentation" (167). I agree that this is indeed a danger (the entire activity of philosophy denigrated to interminable conversations about the possibility of philosophy), but it also risks minimizing what is more fundamentally at stake, namely, a transformation of thinking itself. In this sense, an aesthetic path of philosophy is not another way of philosophy, but another beginning to thinking altogether. As I understand it, such philosophy would no longer be able to lay claim to a privileged path, but would rather radically expand and render irreducibly complex and heterogeneous the scope of thinking. The problem of presentation cannot be separated from the problem of difference.

Again, this is not so much to take issue with Ross' exposition, which surely implies and sometimes explicitly entertains these issues. Rather, my own emphasis on some of the implications of the question of presentation serves to accentuate my agreement that presentation is an issue of paramount importance. It is not something new to think about but rather a new way to think. In this sense, Ross' study is more generally dedicated to what one could in this context call something like the aesthetic turn in philosophy. This turn is not towards the discipline of aesthetics, nor is it some dreamy abdication of the rigor of thinking for fanciful artistic daydreaming. It is a turn, rather, towards the revelation of a more fundamental source of thinking.

The aesthetic turn, that is, the prioritization of the question of presentation (Darstellung), contrasts with the traditional modern emphasis on representation (Vorstellung), which, according to Ross, following Heidegger's lead, reduces being "to the terms of its representability as an 'object' by and for a 'subject'" (3). For Kant, representation was "reducible to the subject's formal powers of apperception" while presentation "explicitly suspends the claims of the subject's powers over material forms and inquires instead about the 'favors' that the subject enjoys and that are extended to it by the material forms of nature" (3). If the first two Critiques are seminal for the Anglo-American analytic tradition, then the third Critique is seminal for this trajectory of the Continental tradition.

What for Kant was the provenance of reflective judgment and taste (sensibility is the domain of aesthetic experience) becomes the issue of the critical source of all thinking for Heidegger, Lacoue-Labarthe, and Nancy. The latter thinkers more or less

alter the defining characteristic that Kant's third Critique had given to the aesthetic as a specific mode of experience within a typology of different spheres of experience. In their hands the elements of this specific mode of experience are generalized: the aesthetic attitude and the vocabulary used by Kant to describe it are brought to bear on things in general. (4)

The problem of presentation has nothing to do with a subject discerning the nature of an object nor is it an issue of the ordering of experience in accordance with some sort of a priori synthetic structure. Presentation is the question of the granting of being (beyond the dichotomy of granter and grantee). It is the still vexing problem of sensibility, or what Ross will describe as "the problem of seeing in existence fundamental or orienting meanings" (166).

Ross' study divides into three sections, each comprising two chapters. The first section is devoted to Kant and the problem of presentation. Ross locates in each of these two chapters certain tensions that pull Kant ambivalently in contradictory directions. In the first chapter, Ross admirably insists that the third Critique must be read as a whole, and therefore that readers should not too quickly ignore the second part of the Critique, namely the Critique of Teleological Judgment. When we allow the two sections of the Critique to confront each other, we find Kant at odds with himself.

On one side, the ideal reference Kant gives to material forms depends on the separation of the fields of nature and art; beauty and charm; and history and taste. On the other, the independence of beauty from charm is because beauty models the moral idea; nature's forms are contingent because they confirm the moral vocation of 'man'; and taste is not an historical artifact because it is an analogical indication of moral autonomy. (16)

Ross' point is well taken. The radicality of the experience of freedom that occurs in aesthetic sensibility is difficult to reconcile with teleological judgments -- and hence Kant's ambivalence: the incomprehensible prodigality of aesthetic experience and the need to "find in material forms a register of ultimate meaning which is not there" (16). Kant endeavors to show that the freedom of nature is in some sense our freedom. "Nature in its beautiful products displays itself as if it were art, as if it were beautiful intentionally" (31). The following chapter develops these tensions in Kant's "pragmatic anthropology" and his articulation of "contexts able to give a foothold in the elements of material life for man's moral disposition" (40).

The middle section considers the radical and expansive transformation of the question of presentation in Heidegger's thinking. A rash reading of Heidegger's Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics, with Heidegger's claim that Kant recoiled from the destabilizing implications of the productive imagination in order to save the traditional categories of metaphysics, might lead one to conclude that Heidegger regarded Kant as an obstacle to the turn to the ontological dimension of thinking. While that to some extent is true, it is similarly true that Heidegger also saw in Kant tremendous openings and Ross' third chapter dedicates itself to balancing our understanding of Heidegger's relationship to Kant. Heidegger adapts "Kant's problem of presentation into the status of ontology" (61), which underlies Heidegger's account of Erfahrung. Although Heidegger famously refused to discuss the third Critique at any serious length, Ross sees its problematic of presentation given a fundamental role as the other beginning of thinking, and, as such, "entirely transformed" (61). In this sense, one could say that Heidegger uses Kant to reverse Kant: for "the ideas of reason do not … precede the elements and context of material life but are in fact drawn from this context in the first place" (81).

The second chapter, among the best in the whole study, offers a subtle reading of the relationship of technology to art. Taking up the Janus-faced presentation of the Gestell (it conceals and reveals), the chapter shows the possibility of a relationship to art not as a privileged kind of work in itself (as if we should simply turn to art as we wage war against technicity), but rather as that which can transform and reorient our thinking of the "relations of presentation" (104) in both art and the Gestell. Art is exceptional not simply because it is an exceptional kind of product in the technological domination of being, but rather because it offers a hint at a different relation of presentation. "It is impossible to overstate the centrality of the question of presentation within Heidegger's thought: at the very least the reflective relation to relations of presentation is the question of thinking as such" (107).

The final section is devoted to Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy, both of whom take the Heideggerian transformation of Kant's question of presentation in remarkable new directions. For Lacoue-Labarthe, presentation is inseparable from a fundamental reorientation of the problem of mimesis and, as such, "the functioning or force of philosophical concepts is aesthetic" (113). Lacoue-Labarthe's "hyperbologic" is mimesis without an original. It repositions "the notion of an intrinsic identity, origin, or essence in terms of a prior relation to a role that is copied, borrowed, or, as in an originary mimesis, devised as a futural act of projection" (114). Lacoue-Labarthe, furthermore, defends poetic language as "the de-figuring and de-constitution of experience that philosophical writing suppresses" (129). It makes possible another kind of thinking, a thinking that no longer needs to orient itself to the fiction of its grounding figure.

Ross concludes with a chapter on Nancy, who argues that art does not reveal "truth," as Heidegger argued, but rather "meaning or sense on the verge of its emergence" (135). Nancy endeavors to present presentation itself (136), "meaning as a coming to presence" (141) itself coming to presence. Ross' exposition of presentation, dramatically with regard to Nancy, but also to some extent with the other three thinkers, is not therefore without its irony. To what extent does an exposition of presentation fully expose the problem of presentation? To what extent does presentation lend itself to the expository voice, especially given that, to some extent, Heidegger, Lacoue-Labarthe, and Nancy do not seek to expose presentation but rather to present it, to present it in its presenting, so to speak. This, of course, is an enormous question, a question for another book.

Even if one disagrees with some of the fine points of her analyses, and I find myself in sympathy with many of them, Ross nonetheless makes a strong and compelling claim for the centrality of the question of Darstellung to the question of the nature of philosophy -- or thinking in some new sense. Even if, as Nancy argues, the word presentation is used "in order to go elsewhere, towards other words" (166), it at least remains a critical portal to philosophy becoming more expansive, less embarrassed by its immense resources. Presentation, and the other words that it gives rise to, may not exhaust philosophy ("this is not to say that no other paths are open to philosophy" (167)), but it affords and in some forceful way demands, that philosophy reconsider its inexhaustible stakes and points of departure.