The Aesthetics of Argument

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Martin Warner, The Aesthetics of Argument, Oxford University Press, 2016, 318pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198737117.

Reviewed by Michael Bell, University of Warwick


The nature of thought is notoriously elusive. Is it best understood through its purer and more impersonal forms such as logic or as the outcome of the complex psychic processes in which it is embedded? Nor is it clear how far the available discourse is a help or a hindrance; whether it makes discriminations or creates illusory entities. What do people mean, or think they mean, when they say my heart tells me one thing and my head another? Martin Warner quotes T. S. Eliot's remark that Pascal's dictum 'the heart has its reasons of which reason knows nothing', far from exalting the heart over the head or offering 'a defence of unreason' (p. 259), is rather declaring that the heart 'is itself truly rational if it is truly the heart' (p. 179). The elasticity of these terms can be seen in the culturally foundational case of Rousseau, who is often thought to privilege feeling over reason but who might better be said to identify them within his understanding of the 'natural' or the 'real'. Warner's study brings an acute and holistic intelligence to bear on these questions.

Pascal's famous distinction between the esprit de géometrie and the esprit de finesse still divides the world of academic philosophy as much as humanity at large, although the distinction remains in the catch-22 trap that you need finesse to appreciate it. Warner's project might be understood as the attempt to impart finesse to those not naturally endowed with it or whose intellectual habits have repressed it. He has finesse and appreciates its leaps and obliquities but he also has a pedagogical patience, reminiscent of the late Paul Ricœur, in spelling out the logic of these implicit processes. His new book expands and develops the argument of his Philosophical Finesse (1989) by moving its insights into new territory. Whereas the earlier study had sought to indicate the role of finesse within philosophical thinking, the present one seeks to identify and validate processes of rational persuasion within the literary modes of poetry and narrative.

One of the special strengths of this study is that it places itself within the thought worlds of its eclectic range of texts. That is to say, rather than conducting an analytic argument drawing on literary illustrations it develops its progressive insight from inward and holistic readings of the chosen works. The outcome is that these works are served by Warner's philosophical enquiry rather than made subservient to it. Since these works of persuasion are already in large measure self-conscious enactments of Warner's thesis, his procedure also allows for the development of a complex, multi-layered exposition as the thematic concerns and rhetorical methods of the works themselves build a richly interactive network. The resultant thickness of realisation is in itself a demonstrative aspect of the argument, and in this context the choice of major texts underwrites its authority and gravitas: Plato's Phaedrus and Symposium, Augustine's Confessions, John Stuart Mill's Autobiography, St John's Gospel and T. S. Eliot's Four Quartets.

It is worth noting here also that, although Warner's theme is positive persuasion, nearly all these works are great studies in resistance. The problem, in other words, may not be to 'see' a truth, as we might say 'intellectually', but to acknowledge it. Sometimes the reasoning mind needs to be distracted and when the front door of the intellect is firmly closed recognition can find a rear or side entrance unguarded. But Warner keeps clear of the possible psychological dimensions which open up here and concentrates on the rhetorical strategies of the texts. In doing so, he bring out another aspect of them. While these trace a rough historical arc, the argument partly departs from chronology in a way that reflects the continual presentness, or recurrence, of the past; a feature that emerges most vividly in Warner's reading of the Augustinian elements in Four Quartets.

The book opens with an extensive chapter on the interrelations of analogy and narrative in which the New Testament parable of the good Samaritan is aligned with Charles Taylor's three argument forms for 'reasoning in transitions' and Wittgenstein's notion of being held captive by a picture. The notion of narrative, which some may think has suffered over recent decades from overuse, is here given a rigorous reworking before the intensive readings of the chosen texts in subsequent chapters.

The reading of Plato's dialogues has undergone a radical change over the last century: once commonly thought of as two-dimensional pedagogical devices for the exposition of a philosophical system, they are now read as dramatic dialogues that are more open-ended and exploratory than doctrinal. Warner's reading of Plato is in this modern tradition, and he contrasts his account of the Symposium with Kenneth Dover's 'geometric' criticism of it to see this dialogue as a model of 'philosophical activity that, though according to method, is not probative' (p. 90). If Plato's dialogues are elusive because of their disseminated authority by which neither the historical Socrates, nor the fictional imagining of him, nor Plato as immediate author, provides the requisite centre, then an apparently opposite possibility is provided by the philosophical autobiography exemplified here by Augustine and Mill. And indeed, the genre 'can certainly render the author's model of what it is to be human "plausible"' in showing how one may live within it. But where theory is inadequate, as Augustine subsequently thought in relation to his Platonic belief in the pre-existence of the soul, the authenticity of the narrative 'is not a final defence' of the philosophical doctrine. (p. 110) Moreover, if the para-logical power of the literary imagination enriches an abstract argument, it is not always by reinforcing it. Indeed, a narrative may unwittingly undermine the rationale the author seeks to place on his own story as Warner finds in the case of Mill's belief that he had recovered from the repressive emotional effects of his early education.

The next chapter returns to another early and culturally foundational text to examine the 'art of rational persuasion' in the fourth gospel. The explicit function of the text is to persuade the reader or hearer that 'Jesus is the Christ, and the Son of God' (p. 129) and Warner considers its rhetorical structure through the cumulative levels of narrative, judgement, sign and transformation. Starting with questions of chronology and historicity he moves finally to elucidate the text's transformative power. Although this final level is not simply contained in the previous ones 'the whole persuasive strategy of the Gospel depends on its being subject to rational controls at the levels of narrative, judgement and sign.' (p. 150) These orders of truth are shown to be distinct yet interdependent.

The following chapter, on Eliot's Four Quartets, draws closely on the preceding discussions while providing a basis for the chapters to follow. The Eliotian speaker, deeply influenced by Augustine, seeks transformation in a world of ambiguous signs. It may be significant that Warner finds the most penetrating appreciation of these poems in two critics who have radically critiqued their world view: F. R. Leavis and David Moody. These critics' partial rejection of the poem's values would appear to leave them especially attuned to its rhetorical power and procedures.

There follow two chapters exploring the notion of the poetic image, starting with Eliot's declaration that 'There is a logic of the imagination as well as a logic of concepts' (p. 174). Is this expression, as Yvor Winters thought, essentially metaphorical, Warner asks, or is there some secretly logical dimension to these ostensibly non-logical forms? If 'logic' here is a metaphor for, say, a sense of compelling persuasion, then the metaphorically linked domains must be kept distinct, otherwise the metaphorical force collapses. But then the metaphor perhaps remains imprecise and potentially sentimental. Jonathan Kertzer has challenged Eliot's formulation arguing that an implicit logical process underlies such poetic occasions: the special logic of imagery is an illusion. Warner, finding Kertzer's case ultimately too geometrically focused on a narrow conception of argument, prefers to 'start not with the notion of an argument, but rather with those of poetic imagery and symbolism' (p. 181). He goes on to invoke the romantic tradition stemming from Coleridge and others in which the symbol, as opposed to allegory, is invested with an ontological claim. The symbol partakes of the reality that it represents. The romantic symbol was most influentially challenged forty years ago by Paul de Man but too absolutely for Warner who seeks to show how poetic images combine to form a 'total effect'. Warner's patient analysis follows the response of Eliot's generation to the late nineteenth-century symbolisme by which they were strongly influenced. Where symboliste poets, as latter day romantics, sometimes claimed ontological insight by mystical means, the modernists were inclined to see the effects of poetic language.

There follows a chapter on imagery and argument, indicating how cumulative structures of imagery create highly specific meanings that are 'typically less explicative than imagistically ampliative' and with a criterion of 'appropriateness' rather than 'truth'. (p. 223) This is a different order of truth which is neither loose nor sentimental. Such an imagistic movement may even encompass rational argument in the sense that, as Kertzer showed, such an argument could be deduced from it but the argument would not be an adequate substitute for the poetic experience. The sequential and dramatic process of the imagery, as an accretion of significances rather than an unfolding of premises, can produce the point of view, experiential context or emotional disposition by which the argument becomes compelling.

The close readings that provide the substance of this book mean that it will be a significant aid to students of its major texts and, since its overarching theme engages the nature of philosophical and imaginative thought as such, it should be a more general resource for all students of philosophy or literature. Within its closely focused textual argument and scholarship it engages the most fundamental questions. Human beings characteristically and properly reason about their experience but reason itself cannot explain fundamental values or motivation. In a broad non-sectarian sense, these are ultimately a matter of existential, which is to say religious, commitment, whether consciously or not, and in that respect it is notable that Warner's choice of texts encompasses several thinkers not so much expressing as exploring the nature of religious faith. It might be objected that religious faith is a special and limiting case for considering the bounds of reason. But the objection can be reversed in so far as formal religious adherence brings into consciousness existential commitments which are otherwise difficult to make properly self-conscious, let alone to justify.

In this respect, one way of thinking about the difference between philosophy and poetry is that philosophy seeks as far as possible to give an objective rational framework to a view of life while poetry embodies, rather than states, a world view. In doing so poetry, as Warner shows, encompasses critique: it may subject its world to internal critique as well as allowing a reader to assess its world view overall. Imaginative literature lets us know from the inside what it is actually like to have such a world rather than 'knowing' it as a set of abstract propositions or by external observation. In that respect, it is not surprising that, while much of the day-to-day business of academic philosophy is properly conducted as minute rational argument, the great philosophical systems are as much poetic as rational in their exposition. By the same token, the most effective opposition to a philosophical system may be a well-aimed metaphor as Nietzsche showed when he called Kant a 'concept cripple'. Warner is no Nietzschean iconoclast and, since it is notoriously difficult to penetrate the intellectual confidence of a self-declared rationalist, this book, which seeks to persuade rather than compel, is likely to be best appreciated by readers with finesse. But it amply illustrates how poetry is the unconscious of blinkered rationalism. When Heidegger said that poetry and thought must 'neighbour' each other, he meant that they are mutually dependent but must not be identified or confused with each other. Warner's book is an exemplary study in, and demonstration of, the elusive interactions between these modes of awareness.

The educative value of the book lies in its pervasive subtle consciousness of how image and idea, or rational argument and poetic movement, interact in mutually reinforcing, as well as modifying, ways. The profit is in the process rather than the product and some readers may feel the portable conclusion is comparatively meagre. But this is in the nature of the case. While some academic careers are built on the successful exploitation of eye-catching half-truths, Warner characteristically does the opposite: patiently unpicking the accretion of half-truths to reach a perhaps unsurprising interpretation but with a fresh depth and completeness of understanding. Schiller remarked that the first effect of philosophical reflection is often to destroy a common sense view of things, but its final and proper effect is to restore common sense at a higher level of appreciation. Whatever its general validity, Schiller's observation catches the spirit of Warner's contribution to literary and philosophical thought.