The Aesthetics of Design

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Jane Forsey, The Aesthetics of Design, Oxford University Press, 2013, 269pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199964369.

Reviewed by Cynthia Freeland, University of Houston


Forsey's book offers an emphatic argument for enlarging the domain of philosophical aesthetics by recognizing the importance of design. She aims to amend this omission by providing a definition of design, creating an account of its distinctive aesthetics, and distinguishing it from topics addressed in the new field of "Everyday Aesthetics." Defining design requires differentiating it from both art and craft. Forsey's theory of the aesthetics of design draws on Kant's aesthetics, in particular his theory of "dependent beauty." And her criticisms of Everyday Aesthetics target what she regards as its fundamental error, the lack of a distinctive normative account of aesthetic value. I will proceed here by examining each of the three parts of her book in turn.

First, in tackling the definition of design, Forsey seeks a metaphysical account of design, but one that is not essentialist. She reviews various accounts of art, juxtaposing formalist with expressionist theories, in addition to various accounts of craft, leading up to her own "working definition" of design. Design cannot be defined in terms of formal features, as, say, Clive Bell sought to define art. Neither is it expressive of an idea or content, as philosophers like R. G. Collingwood have claimed for art. Design may seem more similar to craft than art in that the relevant objects are functional, but it differs from craft in that craft products are hand-made, designed ones mass-produced. Design belongs to the machine age. Forsey concludes that design "is functional, immanent, mass-produced, and mute" (68). (By "mute" she means non-expressive or contentful.) Designed objects include web pages, packaging, airplanes, shoes, clothing, chairs and other aspects of our lived environments, autos, pencils, and even weapons. Despite being mass-produced, a designed object can nevertheless be beautiful and innovative. We can recognize aesthetic aspects of design without paying attention to, or even knowing, who the designer was.

Forsey acknowledges that her discussion does not pay attention to historical and social features, including factors like marketing. Larry Shiner attempted something along these lines in his book The Invention of Art (Chicago, 2001). Sections of his book covering both the Arts and Crafts movement and the Bauhaus show that the art/craft/design distinction can be a difficult one to draw. Some representatives of the Arts and Crafts movement (John Ruskin, William Morris) were anti-machine, others pro- (Frank Lloyd Wright). Similarly, the Bauhaus featured quite varied relations among the design function, material (crafts) processes, and industrial production. Numerous crafted products including chairs, lamps, and textiles were adapted by Bauhaus designers for industrial production. Even today there are many cases in which mass-produced objects bear strong identification with a particular artist-designer, such as the Eames chair. These instances would seem to thwart Forsey's desire to keep the categories distinct. Couture might count as another case of blurred boundaries, because it seems a paradigm of design, but one in which the objects are made by hand in elaborate and costly craft processes.

I turn now to Forsey's second main topic, which is at the heart of her book, her account of aesthetic judgements of design. She draws upon Kant's account of judgements of beauty, with a special focus on the distinction between free and dependent beauty. This will facilitate her account of how the recognition of purpose factors into assessments of the aesthetic quality of designed objects. She devotes considerable space to exposition of Kant, summarizing his attempts to balance objectivism and subjectivism and showing how he advanced beyond predecessors like Hume. Kant differentiated judgements of the beautiful from those of the good or the agreeable, arguing that somehow our subjective judgements of the beautiful carry "objective necessity." To help explain this Forsey cites a more recent version, Nick Zangwill's distinction between "subjective" and "verdictive" judgements. While Forsey likes aspects of this distinction, she believes we need a stronger account of rules by which such judgements are linked together.

Judgements of the beautiful become mixed, Kant thought, when we judge the beauty of an object that serves a purpose, such as a church. He called these cases of "pulchritude adhaerens" or dependent beauty. The aesthetic judgement recognizes aspects of the object -- or of our response to it -- that are not completely governed (or rule-restricted) by knowledge of its purpose. Somehow, this judgement of beauty must still include and in some sense even be "about" the free play of our own faculties, and our imagination, in response to the object (church, etc.) in question. In describing this distinction between two types of beauty, Forsey draws upon interpretations by contemporary scholars such as Paul Guyer, Robert Wicks, Donald Crawford, Henry Allison, Malcolm Budd, and Philip Mallaband.

It is not surprising that Forsey would turn to Kant's account of dependent beauty in trying to create a theory of the nature of aesthetic judgements of design. But it is always risky to wade into the deep and treacherous waters of Kant scholarship. She criticizes Guyer for interpreting Kant as implying that certain objects belong in the category of dependent beauties. Forsey thinks that the distinction concerns judgements, and that judgements about an object can shift between free and dependent beauty depending upon factors like our cultural familiarity. Thus, we may now regard certain ancient objects as free beauties because we no longer recognize their purpose. And Kant himself did allow that even a botanist might enjoy the free beauty of a flower when abstracting away from expert awareness of its biological purpose. Forsey draws especially on Wicks' account, arguing that we exercise free play of the faculties in recognizing the contingent ways in which an object fulfills its purpose. We employ conceptual knowledge, which is historically contingent, while also evaluating aspects of the beauty of design that are more formal and less strictly related to purpose -- like the fins on a Studebaker, in an example discussed by both Wicks and Steven Burns. These fins may not contribute directly to the auto's function but are part of the overall way the function is realized. In general beauty of design has to do with choices among alternative ways of fulfilling a function, which Wicks calls "teleological style." Forsey says the upshot of this Kantian-derived account is that judgements of beauty of design have both synchronic and diachronic aspects. The former is disinterested and universal, the latter more tied to judgements of usefulness and historically relative.

The construal of dependent beauty is probably best left to those with more expertise on Kant than I. This is a field that has been particularly active of late. But I will say that it never becomes clear to me how Forsey answers the question she raised for Zangwill about rules by which a normative or "verdictive" judgement about a purposive object is related to the descriptive or "substantive" one. The conclusion of her discussion of judgements of design is developed through an extended comparative assessment of two Italian espresso pots. Evaluating them requires not just looking at them but using them, since the judgement of beauty must take into account both formal and functional aspects. She favors her own somewhat corroded commonplace Moka version over her friend's more elegant stainless Alessi model: hers has a Bakelite top and handle, so doesn't get hot like his in brass, and hers is easier to clean. She says that disagreements about taste in such a case may involve switches between perspectives looking at the object as either a free or a dependent beauty: it is apparently in the former case that she acknowledges her friend's pot is more elegant. All things considered her pot is more beautiful, combining simplicity of form with ease of use. Just how the free play of imagination works in assessing formal features in relation to functional ones still seems unspecified. Like the Studebaker's fins, these are supposedly part of the "teleological style," a flexible way in which the object fulfills its function. Since the style with which the Alessi pot fulfills its function means that a user's hands will be burned, I gather, this pot is overall less beautiful as a designed object than the more prosaic pot. But still, the free play factor seems to operate independently of the assessment of purpose. It is, not incidentally, a limiting feature of Forsey's discussion of this example that "the aesthetic" almost always gets construed in terms of the beautiful. One might hope that an aesthetics of design has broader scope. What grounds our judgements, for example, of such aesthetic qualities of designed objects as "balanced," "soaring," or "witty," or negative aesthetic features like being "stubby," "squat, " or "garish"?

As I just noted, recent years have seen an upsurge of work on Kant's aesthetics. Guyer wrote a 20-page review essay of no fewer than six books on this topic (in English) in The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism in 2009.[1] Of interest here is that Rachel Zuckert's book Kant on Beauty and Biology attempts to provide a more unified account of the third Critique, placing particular focus on the similarity of purposive judgements involved in assessing both created (art) and natural objects. In his review, Guyer argues for another basis for this linkage in Kant's theory, namely, the tie between judgements of beauty and moral judgements. If Guyer is right, there is a large problem with Forsey's whole approach. She attempts to build her aesthetic theory of design on Kant's aesthetics because she wants to emphasize the sui generis normative nature of aesthetic judgements. The linkage between the aesthetic and the moral is precisely what she will criticize in the proponents of Everyday Aesthetics -- saying that they are in effect subordinating the aesthetic to the moral.

So at this point I turn to Forsey's third project, the meaning of design and everyday occasions of beauty for the field of aesthetics and philosophy more generally. She focuses on two primary expositors of the relatively new field of "Everyday Aesthetics" (hereafter, EA), Yuriko Saito and Arto Haapala (mentioning also Sheri Irvin, Thomas Leddy, and proponents of environmental aesthetics). In this field, authors pay respect to phenomena like the sounds and smells at a baseball game, the distinctive touch and pleasure of stroking a cat, whether a room looks neat or messy, and so on. Forsey's project is similar to EA in aiming to enlarge the scope of aesthetics beyond fine art experienced "inside a frame" so as to encompass more aspects of daily life. However, she claims that EA is too vague and lacking in "theoretical rigor," that it "threatens to collapse aesthetic experience into bodily pleasure in general" (209). The problem stems from lack of attention to normative issues. Insofar as proponents do acknowledge a need for norms, she argues, they borrow them from other areas, mainly ethics, rather than describing distinctively aesthetic ones. She says that EA replaces the synchronic autonomous aesthetic element with another kind of synchronic value borrowed from the realms of morality or, at times, the practical and political spheres. Thus the attempt to ennoble the everyday winds up leaving no place for the everyday experience of truly or autonomously aesthetic values. Even if Forsey is right about Saito and Haapala, the EA approach could be refined so as to incorporate a more robust account of the aesthetic. Perhaps Leddy's book The Extraordinary in the Ordinary: The Aesthetics of Everyday Life (Broadview, 2012) has done this with his notion of the aesthetic "auras" of ordinary objects.

Although I sympathize with her desire to expand the scope of philosophical aesthetics, I cannot concur with Forsey's dire assessment of the current state of the field. There are numerous developments she could have noticed. These include pragmatist aesthetics, along with Richard Shusterman's unique variant of it, somaesthetics, or studies of mass art (such as Noël Carroll's book with the same name). Recent publications have been devoted to the aesthetics of television shows, movies, comics, video games, anime, and other representatives of popular culture. We might also point to works that broaden the scope of sensory appreciation in aesthetics such as Carolyn Korsmeyer's book Making Sense of Taste (Cornell, 1999).

Some of Forsey's pronouncements are simply too extreme, such as the claim that aesthetics has always emphasized observation rather than activity. As Shiner shows, aestheticians ranging from Rousseau to Dewey emphasized the role of ordinary people's involvement in aesthetic activities, Rousseau with his romantic idea of festivals as paradigms of art, and Dewey with his notion of the aesthetic as an experience of a special sort of harmony after disequilibrium. Dewey specifically mentions the example of a fisherman taking aesthetic pleasure from making a fine cast even while in the service of providing his meal for the day (Shiner, 264-5). Another example would be Kendall Walton's influential Mimesis as Make-Believe (Harvard, 1990), which grounds a theory of art on the concept of imaginative play.

Finally, an evolutionary account of art might furnish an altogether distinct sort of theory of aesthetic aspects of the everyday. There has been increasing interest in such theories of art and aesthetics, including Ellen Dissanayake's various books, Denis Dutton's much-heralded The Art Instinct (Bloomsbury, 2009) and Stephen Davies' new book The Artful Species (Oxford, 2012). Evolutionary accounts of art also highlight the importance of artistic activity and aesthetic qualities in ordinary life by explaining their development as part of our very human nature in relation to fitness and competition for mate selection. Dutton offers a cluster definition of art based on 12 key features ranging from skill, style, and special focus to imaginative content, creativity, and direct pleasure. This gives scope for both ordinary and "high art" displays (and appreciation) of artistic excellence in fields ranging from storytelling and dancing to carving and weaving. Dutton had no particular concern to address design, but an account might be developed along his lines without any need to adopt the cumbersome apparatus of Kant's critical theory.

Despite the reservations I have expressed, I agree with Forsey's view that design is a field that deserves more direct attention in aesthetics. And I note that this book appears already to be having an influence: she is to be a keynote speaker at an upcoming conference on the topic of design aesthetics in Italy in May 2014. (No doubt there will be much scope there for attention to the aesthetics of coffeepots.)

[1] Paul Guyer, "The Harmony of the Faculties in Recent Books on the Critique of the Power of Judgment," The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, Vol. 67, No. 2 (Spring, 2009), pp. 201-221.