The Aesthetics of Desire and Surprise: Phenomenology and Speculation

Placeholder book cover

Jadranka Skorin-Kapov, The Aesthetics of Desire and Surprise: Phenomenology and Speculation, Lexington Books, 2015, 185pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498518468.

Reviewed by Cecilia Sjöholm, Södertörn University


Gathering thinkers as diverse as Immanuel Levinas, Eugen Fink and Friedrich Schelling, this book certainly awakens the desire for a philosophical surprise; what can we expect from such a theme, especially since the book promises to reveal a new perspective on aesthetics?

Jadranka Skorin-Kapov's book is a contribution to the discussion of what, after German idealism, phenomenology, and its development in, for instance, French 20th century philosophy, can be considered as aesthetic experience. In this vein, she defines what she calls aesthetic experience proper in the following way: it originates in a desire beyond the objective, transports us into an enigmatic moment of break which can be described in terms of not yet and no longer, a speculative moment in which desire develops into surprise. Surprise brings with it something radically new, and is mind-altering; it lingers with us, and changes the way we see things.

Skorin-Kapov makes the normative claim that this figure accounts for the aesthetic proper: we are to understand that this is what must take place in order for an aesthetic experience to occur. Desire (for something that lies beyond representation, the object, etc,) is a prerequisite, followed by the phases of excess, rupture and recuperation. Surprise is to count as the phase of recuperation. In Skorin-Kapov's reading, aesthetics is not, as in Alexander Baumgarten's classic definition, attached to reflection on sensual experience, and it is not at all attached to knowledge.

Skorin-Kapov describes how such a moment has been negotiated in the history of philosophy under various guises. We encounter it in, for instance, Levinas' notion of the face, Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe's notion of the caesura, Gilles Deleuze's plane of consistency, Maurice Blanchot's concept of the neuter, George Bataille's notion of excess, which in turn is intimately linked to evil in literature, in Michel Foucault's philosophy of transgression, in Slavoj Žižek's notion of the real, and in Maurice Merleau-Ponty's notion of the flesh. These examples by no means exhaust the book as a resource of reflection on the phenomenon of rupture and surprise.

Skorin-Kapov calls on a long line of philosophers as "lawyers" to make her case. I would argue, however, that the book's strength is in her imaginative reading of the history of philosophy rather than in the normative force of her argument. After all, there are many alternative ways of accounting for aesthetic experience, as has been shown throughout the history of philosophy: it can be linked to truth, the imaginary, the senses, affects, judgment, contemplation, and so on. One can also argue that aesthetics can be linked to a kind of knowledge rather than being distinctly set apart from it.

But more important than any argument is the fact that Skorin-Kapov's readings of historical texts point to the existence of a certain figure of thought that exists not in a single tradition, but in a wide net of interconnections between philosophers and traditions. This makes the book worthwhile, but it also points to a certain lack. The book would have been stronger if its horizon had been broadened to include thinkers such as Julia Kristeva, Édouard Glissant and (especially, given the theme) Iris Murdoch. There are, however, also connections made to the writings of Hegel, Lyotard, Foucault, Jaspers, Nietzsche and others.

With a such a long line of thinkers giving witness to the uniqueness of aesthetic experience, this experience must indeed present itself as complex. Skorin-Kapov's argument builds up to this complexity: surprise, although a recuperative moment in her initial formulation, is by no means an easily accessible phenomenon. Skorin-Kapov describes it phenomenologically, first at the level of sensibility, then at the level of reflection, as astonishment; then as the kind of wonder that is inherent in sublimity, and branching out from there. On the one hand, surprise can lead to the kind of admiration that we enjoy in art or that we find ourselves contemplating in science. On the other hand, it can also produce the deeply felt experience of responsibility that grounds the ethical.

Surprise in this sense can by no means be reduced to wonder or astonishment; it cannot be described in terms of a brief moment of sensation but lasts and develops into more profound and more complex forms of reflection. Using the speculative method of Fink, the author argues for a kind of "overflow" departing from the phenomenologically described moment of surprise, taking surprise as a beginning, and then proceeding to discuss the way in which it branches into other forms of experience. In this way, it becomes clear that aesthetic experience must be accounted for as something which is more encompassing than the isolated contemplation of artworks. What is to count as aesthetic connects in a wider sense to the desire of excess, a desire that is perhaps opened to us by artworks such as films, but not necessarily stuck in the encounter with isolated works of art. In this way aesthetics becomes a branch of philosophy that is not about works of art, but more about an approach to the singular event of surprise, irreducible to other kinds of experience.

Skorin-Kapov's book is in many ways an interesting contribution to an important discussion. How are we to conceive of aesthetic experience in terms that take us beyond the constrictive definitions in the 18th century? How can we finally move beyond the modernist paradigm of art's autonomy as a given condition of what is to count as aesthetic, and frame, instead, what goes on at the level of experience? How can we describe what occurs in aesthetic experience that must be deemed as unique and singular, irreducible to any other kind of experience? In pointing to desire and surprise as distinct components of this kind of experience, Skorin-Kapov's argument could in fact be aligned with an older tradition, although this is not an argument she makes. In the 17th century, the notion of wonder was indeed used as a paradigm for what we may call aesthetic experience in a wide sense: think of the Wunderkammer that gathered a collection of objects of desire and surprise, and think of the Cartesian passion of wonder that made its way into the aesthetics of Handel's operas, for instance. In this way, what Skorin-Kapov is exploring is a theme with a long history, adding to it a new sense of profundity with the help, in particular, of 20th century phenomenology.

I certainly welcome this contribution, not least since it may give impulses to new ways of rethinking and reformulating the modernist paradigm of aesthetics. For that reason I wished at times that the book were written in a more accessible way and that the arguments were developed in a more concentrated manner. Personally, to take only one example, I am much attracted to the idea of rereading the work of Friedrich Schelling in this framework. But I would have liked to see a more detailed, responsive reading: how does wonder occur, what happens in the experience of excess in his writings, how does he formulate the experience? As we sift through centuries of philosophical thought, I would have liked to linger a bit longer on a few favored examples, from both films and textual discussions.

Having said that, I believe that Skorin-Kapov is on to something important as she points to the figuration of desire and surprise as a manner of describing aesthetic experience. She argues that it is aesthetic experience proper; I would argue that it is one of several possible ways of describing it. In any case, Skorin-Kapov's book connects well with a history of aesthetics that deserves to be scrutinized and rewritten from new exciting angles.