The Aesthetics of Videogames

Placeholder book cover

Jon Robson and Grant Tavinor (eds.), The Aesthetics of Videogames, Routledge, 2018, 235pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138629585.

Reviewed by Wesley D. Cray, Texas Christian University


Philosophical investigation into both games in general and videogames in particular has increased markedly as of late. Some scholars will view this development positively, seeing games and videogames as capable of possessing aesthetic, artistic, and narrative idiosyncrasies meriting philosophical examination as well as taking them to offer illuminating parallels and contrasts with antecedently legitimized and well-studied media such as film and the novel. Others will view this development negatively, lamenting that inquiry into games and videogames will ultimately offer little in terms of new and serious philosophical insight into either the subjects themselves or the more well-studied media which they might be taken to resemble. This latter attitude has become increasingly difficult to hold, especially in the wake of relatively recent book-length scholarly works such as Grant Tavinor's The Art of Videogames (2009), Dominic McIver Lopes's A Philosophy of Computer Art (2010), and Berys Gaut's A Philosophy of Cinematic Art (2010), as well as Bernard Suits's classic The Grasshopper: Games, Life, and Utopia (2014/1978) and a steadily growing number of journal articles by various scholars. With the arrival of The Aesthetics of Videogames, edited by Jon Robson and Tavinor, my hope is that we can all consider that latter attitude dead and buried.

Robson and Tavinor's volume has an introduction and thirteen essays. The editors deserve praise for bringing together a mix of junior and senior scholars, all of whom write with an accessibility and flair that make this book a pleasure to work through. Its few flaws are largely inherited from its format: many of the essays advance conclusions that could benefit from significant further development, or offer arguments based on premises that are not subjected to the full scrutiny they might warrant. There are also some instances of exegetical redundancy, with, for example, Suit's influential account of gameplay laid out for the reader at least three times. But again, these are problems common to nearly all edited volumes, and coupling that observation with the fact that the loose-ends mentioned pave the way for potentially fruitful future research, they seem to be among the better problems to have. Additionally, the volume mostly avoids another common flaw: whereas in many edited volumes the reader might find herself wishing that the authors had engaged one another a bit more, many of the essays here clearly take into account the others, lending the collection a sense of scholarly cohesion and unity.

Though the chapters are not formally divided into sections, they do hang together in four more-or-less natural groupings. The first set focuses on issues of ontology, broadly construed. Christopher Bartel, in "Ontology and Transmedial Games," discusses the inadequacy of accounts (such as that which Jesper Juul 2005 might be interpreted as offering) according to which games are individuated solely by their rules. Such a view, according to Bartel, fails to correctly individuate certain instances of transmedial games, such as videogame adaptations of sports games, and should be replaced by an account that appeals at least to, not just rules, but also what Bartel calls skill sets. In "Videogames as Neither Video nor Games: A Negative Ontology," Brock Rough argues that, on a proper understanding of the category videogame, membership requires neither that the candidate be a game nor that it be "video," in either a technical or a loose sense. On top of this, he also argues that membership in the category videogame requires neither that the candidate be a narrative nor a piece of fiction. The conjunction of these negative conclusions, according to Rough, gives us some reason to adopt an intentional-historical definition of videogames, analogous to intentional-historical definitions of art (cf. Jerrold Levinson 2011). Finally, in "Videogame Ontology, Constitutive Rules, and Algorithms," Shelby Moser offers a careful discussion of the relation between videogames and algorithms. Taking as her point of departure an apparent tension between the Suitsian claim that a difference in constitutive rules entails a difference in game identity, Moser develops an account of what she calls complete game algorithms, a kind of entity (distinct from the particular code in which the game's algorithm is written) which accounts for the unified identity of a videogame work while also permitting that work to admit of distinct and varied Suitsian games.

The next three chapters focus on aspects of our aesthetic and creative engagement with videogames. In what could be seen as a thematic centerpiece to the volume, Zach Jurgensen's "Appreciating Videogames" advances the claim that we do a disservice to videogames by focusing our critical and appreciative attention on their apparent status as artworks and their similarities to established art forms. Instead, the more appropriate strategy would be to critically and appreciatively attend to videogames as games. To this end, Jurgensen offers an account of the aesthetic evaluation of game mechanics, rooted in and exemplified through careful, critical discussion of several videogames of differing genre. In "The Beautiful Gamer? On the Aesthetics of Videogame Performances," Robson shifts the focus from the aesthetic appreciation of videogames themselves to the aesthetic appreciation of particular videogame playings. He argues that we can and do aesthetically engage with particular videogame "performances" (appealing explicitly to a very inclusive notion of performance) in a manner similar to but importantly distinct from how we engage with "performances" elsewhere, such as in sport, theatre, or film. Next, Aaron Meskin moves the discussion from aesthetic engagement to creative engagement. In "Videogames and Creativity," he closely reviews extant empirical work on the relationship between videogame play and creativity, ultimately assessing that such work fails to establish that such play has (or lacks) any positive or negative effect on the creativity of players. Videogame play does, however, standardly involve creativity on the part of the player, and, according to Meskin, that creativity can be valuable along dimensions different from those of the sort involved in, say, our engagement with film or literature.

A third cluster of chapters addresses issues pertaining to videogames and fiction. In "Interactivity, Fictionality, and Incompleteness," Nathan Wildman and Richard Woodward take up the topic of incompleteness in interactive fictions. Whereas most fictions will be incomplete in some sense -- the Harry Potter series, for example, leaves unanswered questions of Harry's blood type (p. 118) -- interactive fictions involve a distinct and perhaps characteristic variety of incompleteness. According to Wildman and Woodward, this forced choice incompleteness involves, roughly, an initially open question with respect to fictional truth that the player is then forced to settle. Continuing the topic of interactive narrative, Andrew Kania argues, in "Why Gamers Are Not Narrators", that even if it is right to say that players are co-authoring the stories told through their playings of interactive narrative games, those players cannot be said to be narrators of those stories. This argument -- along with its companion in Kania 2018, according to which players are not performers (in a sense narrower than that appealed to in Robson's discussion here) -- works indirectly toward making a cumulative case that we must understand players as players, rather than by assimilating them to more familiar paradigms. Rounding out the section is Tavinor's "Videogames and Virtual Media," which focuses on issues raised by advances in virtual reality gaming. Here, we see a return to metaphysical issues as he agues against those, such as Espen Aarseth (2007) and David Chalmers (2018), who contend that there is an ontological distinction between virtual worlds and objects and fictional worlds and objects, with Tavinor concluding that, properly construed, the virtual is a particular species of the fictional.

The final chapters tackle more of the social and moral, rather than aesthetic, aspects of our engagement with videogames. In "Videogames and Gendered Invisibility," Stephanie Patridge assesses arguments (some academic, some from popular videogame journalism) regarding the seeming underrepresentation or misrepresentation of female characters in videogames and concludes that the data suggest that while "it seems that there may be no female/male gender gap in videogames overall . . . there likely is a representational gender gap in AAA mid- and hard-core games," and likely both "a substantive racio-ethnic gap in videogames overall, as well as a racio-gender gap" and "a substantive gender gap in that videogames tend to reflect the assumption of a male-female binary with respect to gender" (pp. 172-173). She closes by offering suggestions for how feminists might address these issues.

In "Games and the Moral Transformation of Violence," C. Thi Nguyen discusses the interesting possibility (and likely actuality) that, under certain conditions, some acts which constitute violence -- meant here in the sense of "intentionally inflicting a gap between [an] opponent's will and their experience" (p. 183) -- can, in games, be morally virtuous. Throughout, Nguyen offers an illuminating discussion of different varieties of gameplay, including what he calls striving play: the sort of play we engage in when we partake in a game, not for the purposes of simply winning, but instead for reasons having to do with the struggle of the game itself. Mark Silcox turns to issues of romance in "Videogames and the 'Theater of Love'," arguing that though "romantic love and gameplay are in fact trivial variants of the same fundamental type of human activity" (p. 198), the categories of videogame and romance are mutually exclusive. A given videogame might depict a romance, but it could never constitute one for a player insofar as entering into a romance involves a particular sort of self-identification that does not hold between player and in-game avatar. The volume concludes with "Pornographic Videogames: A Feminist Exploration," in which Mari Mikkola focuses on eroge, a "type of Japanese [pornographic videogame] in the anime/hentai-style" (p. 213) in which gameplay involves having or attempting to have sex. After critiquing arguments that eroge as a whole is morally problematic insofar as it objectifies or infantilizes women, Mikkola concludes that the primary moral issue -- with particular eroge games, rather than with the subgenre itself -- is the sexualization of youth.

Many of the most solidly defended conclusions throughout these chapters are negative claims -- such as those about what videogames or gamers are not, or what the data about videogames or gamers do not succeed in showing -- and many of the positive conclusions are more toward the speculative or exploratory side of things. But what certainly emerges from this collection is not only the view that videogames are suitable for serious philosophical reflection, but also the view that they are worthy of serious philosophical reflection as videogames. To take a few examples: whether we focus on Rough's positive, intentional-historical conclusion drawn in light of his negative claims about what videogames are not, Moser's observations about the difficulties of fitting videogames into standard Suitsian accounts of games, Kania's resistance (here and elsewhere) to assimilate what it is to be a player to more familiar frameworks, Robson's claims about the philosophically interesting aspects of aesthetic engagement with particular playings, or Meskin's discussion of the dimensions along which gameplay might involve creativity to a greater degree than engagement with film or serious literature, we see consistently throughout this volume that videogames bring something (perhaps many things!) genuinely new to the table. This is why I earlier stated that Jurgensen's argument about the importance of engaging videogames as games is perhaps a thematic centerpiece of the volume -- though, of course, Jurgensen's claim is complicated if Rough's argument that many videogames fail to be games at all (p. 27-33) is found to be compelling.

For anyone interested in the philosophy of games in general or of videogames in particular, this volume is absolutely essential reading. It is also an important contribution to the interdisciplinary field of game studies, as well as to aesthetics and the philosophy of art more generally. While readers would benefit from antecedent familiarity with the book-length works mentioned in the first paragraph of this review, as well as other influential discussions such as Juul's (2005) theory of videogames and Kendall Walton's (1990) influential work on fiction, the volume remains accessible from start to finish. As such, the book would make a great addition to graduate and undergraduate courses on game studies, philosophy of games, or philosophy of videogames, and individual chapters would fit in quite well on aesthetics and philosophy of art syllabi, as well as on syllabi for courses in applied ethics, gender studies, philosophy of sport, and philosophy of technology.

In an impressively brief time -- just around three-fifths of a century -- we have seen videogames develop from early explorations such as Tennis for Two (1958) to towering achievements (by my lights, at least) like The Legend of Zelda: Breath of the Wild (2017). Philosophers interested in videogames have an exciting opportunity to engage with this art form (or "artifact form," for those who would still want to categorically deny videogames status as art) as it rapidly advances, develops, and matures. As this continues to happen, I suspect that it will become increasingly difficult to avoid informed discussion of videogames when addressing topics pertaining to art, narrative, aesthetic experience, and ethics. This all signals a promising future for the philosophy of videogames, and this volume constitutes both a reinforcement of that small-but-growing field's foundations and a substantial step forward on its behalf.


Thanks to Sam Cowling and John Harris for helpful feedback.


Aarseth, Espen. 2007. "Doors and Perception: Fiction vs. Simulation in Games." Intermediality: History and Theory of the Arts, Literature, and Technologies 9 (Spring): 35-44.

Chalmers, David. 2018. "The Virtual and the Real." Disputatio 9(46): 309-352.

Gaut, Berys. 2010. A Philosophy of Cinematic Art. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Juul, Jesper. 2005. Half-Real: Video Games Between Real Rules and Fictional Worlds. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Kania, Andrew. 2018. "Why Gamers Are Not Performers." Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism 76(2): 187-199.

Levinson, Jerrold. 2011. "Defining Art Historically," in Music, Art & Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 3-25.

Lopes, Dominic McIver. 2010. A Philosophy of Computer Art. New York: Routledge.

Suits, Bernard. 2014. The Grasshopper: Games, Life, and Utopia, 3rd Edition. (Originally published in 1978.) Peterborough: Broadview Press.

Tavinor, Grant. 2009. The Art of Videogames. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell.

Walton, Kendall. 1990. Mimesis as Make-Believe: On the Foundations of the Representational Arts. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.