The Aftermath of Syllogism: Aristotelian Logical Argument from Avicenna to Hegel

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Marco Sgarbi and Matteo Cosci (eds.), The Aftermath of Syllogism: Aristotelian Logical Argument from Avicenna to Hegel, Bloomsbury, 2018, 220pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350043527.

Reviewed by Henrik Lagerlund, Stockholm University


The theory of syllogisms has a remarkable history. For over two millennia it was the core of logical theory. It was only in the late 19th century, when Frege's revolution and the mathematization of logic began, that syllogistics was eventually replaced, although it took even longer before it stopped being taught at schools and universities (that is, as not just a piece of history). In some universities, it is still taught, as the very first introduction to logic, to help students grasp what a deduction is or what a piece of valid reasoning might look like. I cannot think of any other theory has been this influential.

We know quite a bit about its history, from its invention in the Prior Analytics by Aristotle to the high point of logic in the mid-14th century. In the works of John Buridan, logic reached a level not seen again until the 20th century. One result of his thinking was that the original theory of the syllogisms became only a small fragment of a much larger logic.[1] We know considerably less about what happens to the theory after Buridan. In many ways, he was a man out of his time. The coming generations did not show the same appreciation for logic and, in several respects, they did not have the resources to understand what he had accomplished. It was, therefore, with great interest and appreciation that I picked up Marco Sgarbi and Matteo Cosci's newly published volume.

The subtitle -- "Aristotelian Logical Argument from Avicenna to Hegel" -- is somewhat misleading, since the book starts with a chapter on Avicenna, but then jumps to Lorenzo Valla. It is really a book about the treatment of syllogisms outside of scholasticism, which starts with Avicenna although there is no connection or influence by Avicenna on the later Western tradition, at least none that is explored in this book. Besides Allan Bäck's fascinating contribution on Avicenna, the book proceeds chronologically from Valla's and Juan Luis Vives' famous attacks on logic to Hegel's idiosyncratic views.

Avicenna came to replace Aristotle as the main authority in the Arabic philosophical tradition. It is his works and ideas that lay the foundation for the new generation of philosophers after him. This applied to logic as well. He shaped the theory of the syllogisms in his own way and set it on a new path. Bäck's article presents Avicenna's take on the theory. He particularly emphasizes modal syllogisms, which is natural since that is Avicenna's focus as well. The most interesting feature that comes out clearly in Bäck's chapter is Avicenna's metaphysical interpretation of the theory, which is not unlike what can be found in the Latin 13th century. Anyone who does not know much about Avicenna's logic should read Bäck's article. It is very instructive.

The next article, by Alan Perreiah, is a study of syllogisms in what he calls 'renaissance logic'. He seems to means 'humanist logic', however, since he ignores the rich 'scholastic' tradition of the 15th and early 16th centuries. It is of much less interest to look at Valla and Vives, as Parreiah does, since they were not interested in the theory of syllogisms at all. For them, it was the symbol of the corruption of philosophy and learning in the universities. Perreiah is right, however, in his assessment that their criticisms makes no sense, if they are taken as serious logical arguments against the theory of syllogisms. Instead, they should be seen as ideological and political arguments that seek to replace a theoretical pursuit with a practical one.

Stephen Gaukroger contributes the next, although very short, article, which contrasts the theory of the syllogisms with Descartes' idea of a logic of discovery. It contains ideas similar to those in his earlier work.[2] What is most interesting about this article is how confused Descartes seems to have been about logic and how he seems to have misunderstood fundamental parts of the theory of demonstration, which had gone through major developments in the 16th century scholastic tradition; so much so that it was only on the surface the same theory as the one Aristotle had developed. A similar confusion, although perhaps not as serious, can be witnessed in Douglas Jesseph's article on Hobbes. Hobbes seems to have known more about logic than Descartes, but his knowledge was limited to the very rudimentary and sometimes inaccurate summaries published in his time. An interesting note, made by the author but not developed, is that Hobbes seems to suggest a reading of the syllogism that eliminates Aristotle's notion of existential import. I am not sure that this is a systematic suggestion by Hobbes, since in other places, for example, in De corpore (I.3.17), he seems to accept the square of opposition. Hobbes is considerably more interesting when he turns to demonstration and develops his so-called scientific method, which is founded on Aristotle's account of demonstration. This part of Jesseph's article is very interesting.

Although they follow the ideas of Descartes, Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole have a much better grasp of logic than Descartes had. Russell Wahl presents an illuminating take on the Port-Royal logic and on syllogisms. They push an interpretation of the categorical proposition that relies on an idea that the predicate (or attribute, as they call it) is in the extension of the subject. It is not entirely clear what this comes to and several interpretations have been proposed, which Wahl discusses. What is clear is that they push the same kind of reading in their interpretation of the syllogisms. They manage to get a consistent interpretation and show how the second and third figure moods can be reduced to the first, but their view has clear limitations, as Wahl brings out. It is an illuminating article, one of the better articles on the Port-Royal logic that I have read.

Locke had very little interest in syllogisms, as Davide Poggi shows in his article. The perspective on syllogistics as forms of reasoning that he seems to emphasize is very limited. Wolfgang Lenzen's contribution on Leibniz, on the other hand, displays a more interesting account of logic and syllogisms. Leibniz clearly builds on the Port-Royal logic when he develops what Lenzen calls, an 'operator of conceptual containment', that is, 'A is B' is read as 'A contains B'. I am not sure about his interpretation of this as an operator; it seems somewhat anachronistic. His account of the history of logic preceding his analysis of Leibniz's contributions is also very limited and greatly lacking in detail about medieval logic.[3] There also seems to me to be very little in Leibniz's account of logic that is new, and considering that many of the great achievements of medieval logic had been forgotten by his time, he looks more innovative than he is, it seems to me. An example is the idea that the possible is what is not contradictory, which Lenzen heralds as 'an ingenious invention' (p. 143). It was, however, quite common in the Middle Ages. Scotus used this idea to account for what he calls 'logical possibility'. I did appreciate Lenzen's article, however, and I am glad to have read it.

The last two articles in the collection by Alberto Vanzo and Georg Sans, respectively, are interesting, although they contribute little to a further understanding of the theory. Instead their value lies in a deeper understanding of the role the theory of syllogisms has in the thinking of Kant and Hegel. For Kant, the syllogism seems to be a mere tool of justification and, hence, he emphasizes the demonstrative syllogisms. He really only addresses the theory in one short essay called, in English translation, The False Subtlety of the Four Syllogistic Figures, from 1762. He has very little use for the theory as a logical theory, and says that 'logicians should [not] dwell on the doctrine of modes and figures' (p. 157). That statement seems to be directed at Leibniz, who he obviously thought spent too much time on developing logic. It is only the first figure that is important, according to Kant, and it is on it that he bases his notion of analyticity.

Hegel, on the other hand, talks about syllogisms quite a lot in Science of Logic, but the way he approaches it is very far from the original account given by Aristotle. He embeds the theory in his theory of concepts and seems to eliminate quantifiers for universal and particular concepts. As in Kant, syllogisms are viewed in terms of justification. He says for example that 'everything rational is a syllogism' (p. 210), which is in line with a long tradition that equates rationality or reasoning with syllogistic inferences; quite an implausible theory of reasoning, I might add. I found it hard to follow Sans' article, however, and ended up skimming the last few pages. Hegel's view of logic is not Aristotle's or the scholastic's, that is for sure.

Overall, I enjoyed reading this book. It highlights a part of the theory's history that is less well known, and in some sense it is a history of a decline after the heights it reached in the 14th century. But it is nevertheless an interesting history, which sees the theory playing a somewhat different role, not as a formal logic, but as a theory of reasoning. This is in line with the trend in early modern philosophy that seems to approach syllogisms as capturing the rational relation between ideas or concepts in a process of thinking. It therefore takes on a psychological aspect, which logic will not shake until the late 19th and early-20th century rejection of psychologism. I recommend this volume to anyone interested in the history of the theory of syllogisms.


Stephen Gaukroger (1989) Cartesian Logic: An Essay on Descartes Conception of Inference, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Henrik Lagerlund (2017) "Medieval Theories of the Syllogism", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.). 

Wolfgang Lenzen (2004) "Leibniz's Logic", in D. Gabbay & J. Woods (eds.) The Rise of Modern Logic -- From Leibniz to Frege (Handbook of the History of Logic, vol. 3), Amsterdam (Elsevier), 1-83.

Terence Parsons (2014) Articulating Medieval Logic, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] See Lagerlund (2017) for more on this and also Parsons (2014) to really appreciate the sophistication of Buridan's logic.

[2] See Gaukroger (1989).

[3] W. Lenzen's previous work on Leibniz's logic is much more interesting than this article. See foremost (2004) and his excellent contribution to the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy on 'Leibniz: Logic'.