The Age of Culpability: Children and the Nature of Criminal Responsibility

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Gideon Yaffe, The Age of Culpability: Children and the Nature of Criminal Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2018, 239 pp., $40.00, ISBN 9780198803324.

Reviewed by Douglas Husak, Rutgers University


Why should criminal justice systems treat those under 18 more leniently than an adult who commits the same offense? This is the question nominally addressed by Gideon Yaffe. I say he addresses this question nominally because his reach extends much further. Like any good philosopher, Yaffe has produced a book with ideas that are exceedingly far-reaching. Along his journey, he discourses on developmental psychology, the nature of criminal culpability, the weight of reasons, the legal status of visitors and the indigent, the nature of desert, and a whole lot more. To be sure, Yaffe is careful to connect each of these broad topics to his central question of juvenile justice. But they are fascinating in their own right; to many of us, Yaffe's positions on these matters may be the most interesting parts of his book -- more interesting than their application to the narrow question he explicitly pursues. Yaffe himself probably concurs with this assessment. His not-so-secret ambition, he confesses, "is to forward theories of the nature of criminal culpability, of desert for wrongdoing, and of the kind of participation in the law that is required to support unmitigated liability for crime" (12). The issue of why kids (as he calls them, "juveniles") should be given a break (that is, treated leniently) simply provides the occasion for raising these larger concerns. I found the application of Yaffe's theoretical apparatus to his nominal question to be among the least persuasive parts of his book. As a result, I recommend it more strongly to those with a general expertise in criminal theory than to specialists in juvenile justice. The former in particular will be rewarded; this book contains a mountain of novel and important insights about several of the most central questions in the philosophy of criminal law. But I expect that specialists in the trenches of the juvenile justice system who wonder about why they dispense leniency are likely to remain uncertain about the rationale for what they do.

Yaffe sets a high bar for what he is willing to count as an acceptable answer to the question of why kids should be given a break: All kids, and not just some, should be treated leniently. Moreover, they should be given a break because they deserve it; they are less culpable for their crimes than adults who behave similarly. This answer is applied to even the most horrendous offenders, such as Christopher Simmons, the 17-year-old whose infamous Supreme Court case (Roper v. Simmons) Yaffe recounts at the very beginning. Simmons, we are reminded, perpetrated a gruesome murder apparently for a thrill: he abducted a randomly-chosen mother from her bedroom, tied her hands, legs and head with duct tape, and threw her off a bridge. According to Yaffe, even Simmons deserves a break; he is more deserving of leniency and is less culpable for his murder than an 18-year-old who committed the identical offense.

In Chapter 1, Yaffe presents a number of devastating arguments against the pervasive tendency to accept a response to his question that takes age as a proxy or surrogate for some other characteristic that may seem relevant to the way our criminal justice system should treat kids. Many such responses are a staple in academic and non-academic circles, where empirical findings in neuroscience and cognitive psychology are routinely cited to argue that kids should be given a break because their brains are undeveloped, or because they are more impulsive, or because they are especially prone to peer pressure, or because they will mature and grow out of their criminal tendencies. Many and perhaps each of these generalizations about kids is true, but Yaffe shows that they fail to satisfy his burden of showing that all kids are less culpable. First, the premise that bridges each of these characteristics with a justification for leniency is hard to support. Why does impulsivity or susceptibility to peer pressure, for example, entitle anyone to a break? Second, if the characteristics do entitle kids to a break, no separate rationale for leniency is needed; kids would qualify under an excuse the law already recognizes. Third, each of these empirical claims is both overinclusive and underinclusive. Some kids are bound to lack and some adults are bound to possess any given physical, neurological, or psychological trait that is said to entitle them to leniency. Finally, our rationale for giving kids a break is not really dependent on these empirical findings: If they turned out to be false, we would remain just as confident as ever that kids deserve a break. Yaffe thus rejects the adequacy of any answer to his question that appeals "to the growing and important work mapping and quantifying the neural and psychological differences between kids and adults" (19). With these familiar answers so convincingly demolished, the stage is set to take an entirely new direction.

As we will see, Yaffe's solution is certainly novel. It initially struck me as wildly implausible. But no philosopher should be too quick to dismiss an answer when each of the competing alternatives is as bad or worse. In view of the difficulties he confronts, perhaps we should pause to inquire whether Yaffe is correct to set the bar so high for what he will count as an acceptable solution. Maybe there is no single answer to his question; one kid might deserve a break for a different reason than another, but just about any kid will fall under one or another rationale for leniency. I say just about any kid. Should we really insist that it has to be true that all kids must deserve a break -- -simply because they are kids? Should a break be given even to the most precocious 17 year-old, who we stipulate to be identical in all psychological respects to an adult? Yaffe never takes seriously the possibility that he might be mistaken that a single rationale can be found for why all kids qua kids deserve leniency. He is "certain" the existing practice of giving all kids a break "has a good rationale" (3) and that his job as a legal philosopher is to find it. He describes as "morally intolerable" (183) a proposal to alter our existing practice of showing leniency to all kids. But in light of the difficulty he encounters in answering his question, I came away less confident that the burden he describes can be sustained.

As I have indicated, Yaffe's solution is original. Since he claims that kids are owed a break because they deserve it and are less culpable for their crimes than adults who behave similarly, Yaffe owes his readers theories of culpability and desert -- the tasks he undertakes in Chapters 3 and 4. Although these chapters are the best in his book -- his views about desert should be required reading for both friends and foes of a retributive penal philosophy -- space allows me to focus only on his theory of culpability. He begins with moral culpability: "To be morally culpable for a morally wrongful act is for the act to manifest an imperfection in the way in which one recognizes, weighs, or responds to the reasons generated by the properties of the act in virtue of which it is morally wrongful" (70). He uses the (somewhat cumbersome) shorthand "modes of transaction with reasons" to refer to the agent's modes of recognition, weighing, and response to reasons. Thus, moral culpability for an act depends on two variables: "what an act manifests about the agent's modes of transaction with reasons" and "what morality demands of agents when it comes to such modes" (71).

I think Yaffe is absolutely correct to defend a reason-responsiveness account of moral culpability. In the course of explicating his theory, he offers an impressive and original account of what is involved for an act to manifest something about an agent's mode of transactions with reasons. Nonetheless, I dispute some of the details of his explication. In particular, I believe that moral culpability requires fault or culpability with respect to the imperfections in the modes of transaction with reasons manifested in wrongful conduct. In other words, the culpable agent must not only act wrongfully and exhibit an objective defect in his reason-responsiveness, but also be culpable for doing so. What exactly such culpability involves is a matter of some dispute. But its absence shows why those who fail to respond to reasons correctly are not culpable for their failure when they could not have been expected to do better. If someone has been subjected to discriminatory or racist propaganda throughout his life, for example, he should not be blamed in given situations for responding incorrectly to the objective reasons that we enlightened philosophers now recognize.

But Yaffe counters that introducing culpability at this point leads to a regress: "How could it be that any finite creature managed to be culpable for anything if culpability for conduct requires culpability for something else, which in turn requires culpability for yet something further, and so on? (73) In reply, I don't understand why a requirement that blameworthy agents must be culpable for their defective reasoning introduces a regress at all, let alone an infinite regress. It simply adds a new, additional normative dimension to the determination of whether persons who act wrongfully are blameworthy for what they have done. Nonetheless, I repeat that most of what Yaffe says about moral culpability is important and correct.

What is most significant for present purposes, however, is his claim that moral culpability is not equivalent to criminal culpability, and that the latter is what counts when explaining why kids deserve a break. According to Yaffe, each domain of norms (such as aesthetic norms) supplies its own distinctive reasons for persons to conform to them. Unlike what is involved in being morally culpable for a moral wrong, to be criminally culpable for a criminal wrong "is for the act to manifest modes of recognition, weighing, or response to legal reasons discordant with the legal reasons in virtue of which the act is in violation of a norm of criminal law" (72-73). If a legal reason not to commit a criminal wrong is less weighty for you than for me, your commission of that wrong manifests less of a defect in your mode of reasoning, and therefore is less criminally culpable, than mine. Herein is the key to why Yaffe thinks kids deserve a break. As I will explain below, he believes they are owed leniency because their legal reasons to conform to law are less weighty than mine.

Can Yaffe be right that all kids deserve a break (if indeed they do) because they have weaker reasons to refrain from committing crimes than adults? I am unconvinced; my greatest reservation with Yaffe's analysis involves my disagreement about the relevance of legal reasons to moral judgments. Return to Simmons. How culpable is he relative to an adult for his awful murder? Assume that Yaffe is correct that the answer to this inquiry depends on the strength of Simmons's reasons not to do what he did. An adult has a set of reasons of enormous strength for not killing. Presumably these reasons overwhelmingly outweigh any competing considerations when the murder lacks any conceivable justification but is motivated entirely by thrill-seeking. But Simmons, according to Yaffe, has less reason not to kill for the excitement of doing so. The sum total of his reasons not to kill are less weighty because his legal reasons not to kill are less strong -- even though his moral reasons, Yaffe would agree, are just as powerful as those of an adult. When we ask why (that is, for what reasons) someone should not commit a murder, do the legal reasons against the act really add anything to the preexisting moral reasons? If not, why does a weaker legal reason in the case of Simons detract from the sum total of his overall reasons? I think both Simons and an adult have equally weighty reasons not to murder. If kids deserve a break, it cannot be because the sum total of their reasons not to murder is less strong than those that apply to adults.

I am inclined to believe that law adds nothing whatever to the weight of the reasons that apply to the commission of a crime -- -at least, not to the particular crime committed by Simmons, which, after all, is the example to which Yaffe applies his theory. When the criminal law proscribes murder, it does not create a new reason that adds any weight to the preexisting moral reasons. It simply recognizes and renames an old reason that existed all along. Therefore, the sum total of the set of reasons that apply to both kids and adults are equally weighty. I admit that my belief that the law adds nothing to the reasons to refrain from crime is somewhat problematic when the crime in question is an instance of a malum prohibitum. Whether and how the law is able to create new moral reasons not to perpetrate mala prohibita offenses is a deep problem that has consumed many a legal philosopher. Yaffe, to his credit, has many profound observations about this category of offense. But whatever analysis is provided, no one would categorize Simmons's crime as anything other than a malum in se. We need not struggle to account for the reasons not to perpetrate a malum prohibitum when we inquire whether Simons deserves a break. The wrongfulness of killing for a thrill is not dependent on the law; it would be just as wrongful and culpable for Simmons to have done what he did even if no law had proscribed it. In other words, the sum total of the overall reasons for anyone -- kid or adult -- not to kill is unaffected by legality. Or so it seems to me.

Yaffe, however, thinks Simmons has less reason not to kill than an adult. He may have the same moral reasons not to kill as an adult, but when we assess whether and to what extent he should be punished, it is his legal reasons that should control. According to Yaffe, the legal reason for the kid not to kill is less strong than the legal reason for an adult not to kill because the kid "has less say" (159) (that is, less voice) in the creation of the law. Generally, "the strength of a legal reason for a particular person to refrain from criminal conduct is in part a function of the degree to which he has a say over the legal facts that are constitutive of that legal reason's weight" (158). Although kids have some say over the content of law, they have less than adults, mainly because they lack the vote. Thus, Yaffe bluntly indicates "that the thesis of this book can be summarized with the following slogan: Kids ought to be given a break because they are disenfranchised" (168). Expressed somewhat differently, kids have less reason than adults to conform to law not because of their psychological or neurological properties, but "because of the political meaning of age" (125).

Suppose, however, that kids did have just as much say in the creation of the law. I realize that Yaffe provides original ideas about why this would be a terrible idea, but let us put those worries aside and assume that kids and adults had an equal say. Why would removing the disparity in their say over the creation of law make any difference to their culpability for killing? Surely it would make no difference to the content of the law, which clearly would remain unchanged regardless of who is or is not entitled to vote. So how could it alter the weight of their overall reasons? If I am correct that the moral reasons are all that count, giving kids a say identical to that of adults would make no difference to the weight of their reasons not to kill. Moral reasons, as Yaffe readily admits, are not created by persons in the way that legal reasons are created. If moral reasons are what matter, giving kids a say would add nothing to the weight of their reasons not to commit the murder perpetrated by Simmons.

Yaffe's ground for disagreeing derives from the significance he attaches to the principle of legality. As should become clear, his argument at this juncture is absolutely crucial for his solution to the problem of why kids deserve a break. Suppose that a particular instance of a malum in se were not proscribed by the criminal law. In case this supposition seems too fantastic to contemplate when we focus on the crime perpetrated by Simmons, recall that spousal rape was not criminalized in the United Kingdom until 1992. Imagine that a British husband commits an act of nonconsensual forceful sexual penetration against his wife in 1990. Would criminal punishment be permissible? Everyone would agree that punishment would be legally impermissible, because the husband has committed no offense, and the law does not authorize punishment in its absence. But I believe the issue of whether punishment would be morally impermissible is much harder to answer. If the perpetrator of spousal rape were punished in 1990, I am unsure he would have a moral complaint in addition to his legitimate legal complaint. The Nazis punished at Nuremberg are the best candidates for raising this question. Yaffe seems convinced that punishment in such a case would be morally objectionable. He holds "it is morally wrong to violate the Principle of Legality" (75). Thus, he concludes: "Criminal culpability has independent and distinct moral significance for what the state is justified in doing to someone" (13). And "when we turn to what punishments it is morally permissible for the government to issue, we find that the facts about criminal culpability and criminal wrongdoing control" (76).

Again, I do not quite see the moral injustice of which Yaffe protests. But suppose he is correct in his charge of moral injustice when a person is punished for committing a malum in se that happens not to be prohibited by law. Hence the husband who is punished for raping his spouse in 1990 would have a moral as well as a legal complaint about his treatment. Even then, however, it does not follow that when the law does prohibit spousal rape the husband gains a new reason not to rape, so that he now has more reason than before. Instead, the law simply recognizes a reason he had all along -- although a sophisticated defense of my position, as Yaffe recognizes, may require a detour into jurisprudential issues about the nature of law and legal reasons that penal theorists seldom feel the need to confront. Efforts to account for whether the principle of legality has moral (as well as legal) significance is both crucial to his project and unexplored generally, at least among philosophers of criminal law.

In Chapter 7, Yaffe applies his controversial answer to other groups that might be thought to deserve a break on grounds similar to those he provides: visitors, the indigent, legal and illegal immigrants, prisoners, and disenfranchised felons. To resolve these issues, he draws a number of valuable distinctions; "different groups are different from each other, and from kids, in ways that matter to the applicability of the argument for giving them a break" (186). His views here are careful and nuanced. But I wonder whether and how his argument helps to explain whether or why the law should treat kids differently from adults in contexts other than those involving criminal liability: to marry, run for office, serve on juries, make contracts, own property, and the like. The rationale to which he appeals has no obvious application to these practices. Here, one is tempted to invoke the very kinds of theories he rejects in the context of crime and punishment. If we stipulate that an exceptionally precocious and mature kid wants to make a contract, why should he be disqualified simply because of his age? Isn't age merely a proxy for what really matters? If so, for what is it a proxy?

If we reject Yaffe's solution, what is the correct answer to why kids deserve leniency? I confess to uncertainty. Again, I suspect he may have set the bar too high for what is to count as an acceptable answer. As he and I agree, however, the topic of why children are less blameworthy than adults "remains under-theorized by moral philosophers" (5, n.10). Yaffe's book is bound to help to correct this state of affairs. I hope and predict that it will stimulate a wave of efforts to explain whether and why our criminal justice system should treat kids more leniently than adults. But even if no flood of future efforts is forthcoming, Yaffe's book stands as a valuable contribution to several of the most central and important topics in the philosophy of criminal law.