The Age of Responsibility

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Yascha Mounk, The Age of Responsibility, Harvard University Press, 2017, 280 pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674545465.

Reviewed by Scott Anderson, University of British Columbia


This is an impressive, frequently charming, and partly successful attempt to illuminate the way a distinctive understanding of “personal responsibility” — one which might be described as “responsibility as accountability” — has taken on an increasingly large and problematic role in Western politics and political thought over the last 50 years or so. It seems aimed to appeal well beyond the philosophical community, with hopes of motivating a thoughtful and concerned readership to revamp the way our conception of “personal responsibility”[1 functions in political and social life. The book employs a fair amount of extant philosophical work to provoke a change in our public discourse and practices, while also performing some creative philosophical work that might be of interest to disciplinary philosophers. It is overall an erudite and enjoyably readable book; its 207 pages of main text are generously spaced and written fluidly, with a minimum of jargon. My enthusiasm for the book is not, however, without reservations, particularly about the more philosophically creative aspects of the text.

Mounk weaves together numerous topics and themes, though the main points of the book can be boiled down to a few claims, I think. First, he offers a reading of the intellectual history of “personal responsibility” since the end of World War II, arguing that in a diverse array of public and academic discourses, a “responsibility framework” has taken shape and come to prominence as a normative view about the importance of “personal responsibility” in policy, social science, and philosophy. While Mounk diagnoses a broad intellectual trend in this direction, he is particularly concerned with the “punitive” aspect of this framework as it has taken shape in welfare and social assistance policy.

This responsibility framework entails two key assumptions that help us understand the contours of political thinking in the age of responsibility:

  1. If somebody is responsible for a bad outcome, his or her responsibility for that outcome (supposedly) lessens the extent to which he or she has a just claim to public assistance.
  2. As a result, the question of whether somebody deserves public assistance (supposedly) turns on the prior question of whether he or she can rightfully be considered responsible for being in a situation of need. (19)

Mounk holds that this punitive attitude (dubbed “responsibility as accountability”) is reflective of a “pre-political” (or “pre-institutional”) conceptualization of “personal responsibility,” which treats it as a natural fact of the sort philosophers can discern through careful analysis of the concept.

As an advance, Mounk proposes a “positive conception” of responsibility aiming to retain the valuable features we associate with people taking responsibility, while avoiding the more punitive aspects of the responsibility framework. He suggests it differs from the present responsibility framework in two main respects. First, it holds that judgments of “personal responsibility” should follow from society’s setting reasonable expectations for how people should act in light of the political values its institutions are intended to further.

the point of responsibility-tracking institutions is not to serve the singular value of rewarding good, and punishing bad, behavior; rather it is to make institutions that serve a whole set of values . . . sustainable over time . . . the expectations we impose on citizens are themselves subject to a democratic debate about which of these values to prioritize. (191)

A person should be judged responsible for outcomes, not based on their causal contribution to them, but on the basis of whether one meets or disappoints those expectations. But determining that an individual has met or failed to meet expectations does not, Mounk thinks, answer the question of what should follow from meeting/failing to meet expectations. Further questions arise as to whether and how we should be held to account for our actions, given the multiple values at stake. If, for instance, punishing someone for failing to meet expectations has significant negative externalities, such as to her family or to her chance to be a contributor to society in the future, then imposing such accountability may not be warranted. So Mounk’s account differs from the current responsibility framework in a second way, by requiring a more complex judgment about how we should respond to judgments of responsibility, in light of a multiplicity of political values connected to responsibility.

This short synopsis elides many interesting aspects of the book. But I want to spend the remainder of my space raising some concerns. My sense is that Mounk’s analysis of the problems with our current responsibility practices is less perceptive than it might be, and consequently the philosophical remedy prescribed is not as clearly warranted as Mounk suggests.

I find plausible, but cannot competently judge, Mounk’s reading of the intellectual history underpinning his claim that “personal responsibility” has become more prominent in political thought in the last 40-50 years.2 However, I think his suggestion that there is a broad shift in the conceptualization of responsibility in this period, in particular toward a reductive understanding of “personal responsibility,” is not well supported. Mounk fails to note two other key transformations during this period, at least in the U.S. (which is the main focus of his study): namely, the encodings of racism and class-warfare (waged by the privileged against the less fortunate) into facially neutral policies and principles of law and government practice. The heightened emphasis on “personal responsibility” has been, I would allege, one of the ways of disguising and rationalizing numerous moves to reify and extend the privileges of whites and the wealthy against pushes for greater equality and social justice. Virtually all of the legal and welfare policy changes Mounk cites as evidence of the heightened role of “personal responsibility” have racial and/or class dimensions to them that could explain much of the trend to “punish” those who fail to act “responsibly,” while shielding the powerful from similar scrutiny. Hence, I would propose considering the changes Mounk notes in this time period as something like ideological decoration of policies motivated on other grounds, rather than actual changes in the understanding of responsibility.

It is beyond my capacity here to defend this reading of the history, but here is a way to test it: has the increased emphasis on “personal responsibility” been applied equally across race and class lines? If the bulk of heightened concern for “personal responsibility” that Mounk identifies is concerned with punishing those in the lower social strata, and not with whether the rewards obtained by higher echelons are merited (or their own crimes punished), then the matter at issue is probably not simply one of “personal responsibility,” promoted for its own merits. While Mounk notes that race and class factors contribute to outcomes that belie “personal responsibility,” and notes also some of the vagaries in the historical trend he describes, he seems not to consider deeper explanations for the intellectual movement he tracks, treating it instead as an apparently autonomous shift in our zeitgeist. I’d say he also misses the hint in his description of the new attention to “personal responsibility” as “punitive”: a priori, one might suppose that tracking responsibility is as much concerned with justifying rewards as punishments, at least from a neutral perspective. Instead, it seems to me that the recent history of U.S. social policy is largely one of the powerful imposing “responsibility for thee, but not for me” — especially punitive responsibility — as they simultaneously protect their unearned advantages (e.g., by eliminating inheritances taxes).

Mounk’s depiction of the development of the “responsibility framework” across politics, political science, sociology, criminology, and philosophy is impressive in its breadth. Here he seems to take his cues from movements in political philosophy (and associated arguments over responsibility in the free-will/determinism debates) as justifying a reading of this intellectual movement as supporting a reductive, causality-focused, pre-political conception of responsibility.

Mainstream proponents of the responsibility framework talk about personal responsibility as a pre-existing entity in the world: a just society, they imply, would perfectly track people’s pre-existing qualities, rewarding them when they have acted responsibly, and punishing them when they have acted irresponsibly. (137)

But as Mounk himself notes, abstruse philosophical discussions of responsibility (for instance, in debates over luck egalitarianism or the principle of alternative possibilities) carry little weight with most people attempting to assess a person’s responsibility for their actions or their situation. If one leaves aside writings by academic philosophers, and focuses on just the views of the politicians and social scientists that Mounk canvases, I think it is hard to find (in this book, anyway) textual evidence that theorists, or even politicians, favor such a reductive, pre-political view. Rather, the passages and citations Mounk assembles tend to be much less determinate. They include calls to “demand responsibility from all” (Bill Clinton (37) who also castigates “the bad habit of expecting something for nothing”), and suggest a “revival of interest in human agency within both sociological and social policy debates” (sociologists Alan Deacon and Kirk Mann (55), a position also attributed to James Q. Wilson (62-62). And Amy Gutman and Dennis Thompson are quoted noting the interrelations of several concerns: “Fair workfare takes individual responsibility seriously as a requirement in welfare reform. But it is grounded on a value of mutual dependence, which is implied by reciprocity, rather than the value of independence or self-sufficiency” (86). In other words, while I would not dispute that politicians and policy makers have used our conception of responsibility punitively, this seems to me a motivated abuse of the concept, and not something easily justified by much if any of the theoretical work Mounk uses to illustrate a parallel trend in academia outside of philosophy.3

Given the book’s brevity, Mounk may be able to support his reading of the intellectual history if given sufficient space and indulgence by his readers. But I suggest the exercise will turn out to be futile, since, it seems to me, that many if not all of the figures cited are, in their own way, doing the very kind of work he suggests we do: trying to construct a working public conception of responsibility that responds to a variety of the considerations we need our understanding of “personal responsibility” to mediate. That is, at different points in their discussions, one will find concern with fairness, equality, promoting dignity, and creating incentives (which need not equate to concern with rewarding/punishing good/bad behavior), among other factors. Most significantly, the array of Mounk’s sources all seem aware of the potential for change and development in how we conceptualize and use our concept of responsibility; that is, they all seem to be engaged in making largely instrumental arguments about how we should understand responsibility, rather than defending some pre-theoretic conception from a god’s-eye perspective. So, from looking just at what non-philosophers have been saying for evidence of a novel, reductive conception of responsibility, I am dubious that one will see as much change as Mounk suggests, at least not in a unified, reductive direction.

So, if the attack on welfare and equality in the name of “personal responsibility” amounts to conceptual misuse or abuse — (mis)using it as an ideological cudgel — rather than the result of a new and misguided intellectual project, then it is not clear that our present thinking about “personal responsibility” is as wide of the mark as Mounk seems to suggest. Nonetheless, the “positive conception of responsibility” he sketches may be valuable and worth exploring. I think there is something quite appealing in making explicit the political, institutional considerations that properly contribute to our thinking about how to attribute “personal responsibility.” It is particularly valuable to advance these considerations against the sort of reductivism that Mounk rightly identifies in academic philosophical discussions of responsibility. Furthermore, his main suggestions — highlighting the importance of taking responsibility for yourself and for others, and of respecting others by holding them responsible — seem very valuable considerations, though his discussion of them is quite brief.

However, I would say his positive account has some weaknesses as well. For one, I think that it understates the importance of intention (by not mentioning it, so far as I can see) in establishing a person’s responsibility for those effects in the world that she brings about intentionally. This may be because a person’s intentions might be regarded as among the “pre-institutional” considerations that Mounk is at pains to disparage as useful in determining an agent’s responsibility. But it seems to me that understanding intentional action is crucial for understanding how agents incur responsibility for outcomes, so it would have been useful to take up this topic more directly. Secondly, I was also struck by how dynamic Mounk seems to believe the determination of responsibility might be, since it seems that part of the point of setting responsibility in an institutional framework is to determine more stable principles for how responsibility will be assessed and attributed, rather than leaving it to ad hoc judgments. I say this in light of a brief illustrative discussion Mounk gives of how a community might determine whether and who to compensate among various victims of an environmental cleanup that ends up harming several individuals (194-99). He suggests that there could be differing right answers about whom to blame, whom to hold harmless, and whom to compensate, depending on how one weighed different considerations. However, among the relevant considerations, Mounk does not include the dictates of the law at the time of the incident, which one might hope would be decisive. The various considerations he puts forward seem to me to be valuable for thinking about what laws we should enact, but an institutional approach to judging responsibility ought, I think, to put a premium on setting out clear principles of accountability in advance of the various opportunities individuals have for acting, and then adjudicating cases in accordance with those laws. That way, individuals will have a way of judging what the consequences of their actions are likely to be (if their intentions are achieved), so they may act accordingly. For these and other reasons, I would be happy to see the discussion in the last two chapters expanded to more fully develop Mounk’s “positive conception of responsibility.”

The above criticisms notwithstanding, I think Mounk’s book is a laudable and fruitful achievement, in particular for engaging a broader swath of the public than is generally invited into our debates. The task attempted here — addressing the basis of our practices of judging “personal responsibility” in a way that is clear and approachable for laymen — is of considerable difficulty and yet very important. While I’m not sure it advances those debates within the discipline much, it offers a useful example of how to connect the more abstract and abstruse issues in analytic philosophy to manifestly real and important concerns. Whatever one thinks of this book, one is likely to come away impressed by its author for how he takes up this challenge, and interested in what else he has to say.

1 I will retain the quotation marks around this phrase (“personal responsibility”) throughout, since it is a technical notion at the center of Mounk’s discourse which he argues should be conceptualized differently from how he thinks it is currently conceptualized by many of his targets.  Given the lack of agreement about what underlies this conceptualization (if anything specific), I will leave this phrase unanalyzed throughout.


2 Because it’s a short book covering a wide spectrum of intellectual currents, the evidence offered for his reading of intellectual history is necessarily thin.  Those better versed in the relevant subjects could more usefully judge whether he has depicted these trends accurately or not.


3 Perhaps the best case for demonstrating a shift towards the naturalistic, reductive concept Mounk describes is in the field of criminology as exemplified by the work he cites from James Q. Wilson.  But even if that’s true of some/all of that field’s work, this doesn’t show there is a trend across disciplines.  Moreover, trends in criminology are not an obvious indicator of trends in policy around welfare/social assistance, which is the principal area of Mounk’s concern.