The Age of the Poets: And Other Writings on Twentieth-Century Poetry and Prose

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Alain Badiou, The Age of the Poets: And Other Writings on Twentieth-Century Poetry and Prose, Emily Apter and Bruno Bosteels (trs.), Verso, 2014, 256pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781781685693.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


This volume gathers together Alain Badiou's fugitive writings on literary modernism, or what Badiou calls "the age of the poets," which on his chronology extends from Arthur Rimbaud (1854-91) to Paul Celan (1920-70). Badiou's touchstone is Stéphane Mallarmé (1842-98), specifically Mallarmé's conception of la poésie pur in which the poem is no longer a form of mediation but a materialization of language whose words are scattered as if by chance across the white space of the printed page.[1] In "Crise de vers" (1896), for example, Mallarmé writes:

If a poem is to be pure, the poet's voice must be stilled and the initiative taken by the words themselves, which will be set in motion as they meet unequally in collision. And in an exchange of gleams they will flame out like some glittering swath of fire sweeping over precious stones, and thus replace the audible breathing in lyric poetry of old -- replace the poet's own personal and passionate control of verse.[2]

What makes Badiou's occasional pieces of interest is that they amount to a Marxist's defense of poetry against, for example, Jean-Paul Sartre's Marxist anti-modernist polemic, Qu'est-ce que la littérature? (1947):

Poets are men who refuse to utilize language. Now, since the quest for truth takes place in and by language conceived as a certain kind of instrument, it is unnecessary to imagine that they aim to discern or expound the true . . . . In fact, the poet has withdrawn from the language-instrument in a single movement. Once and for all he has chosen the poetic attitude that considers words as things and not as signs.[3]

Poetry, turned away from the world (on the wrong side of language), is mere bourgeois aestheticism. By contrast, for the writer of prose (Marx, for example, or Sartre as he imagines himself) words are not things but actions (p. 23). They are interventions by which the writer engages the world in order to change it: "To write is both to disclose the world and to offer it as a task to the generosity of the reader" (p. 65).

Badiou does not directly gainsay Sartre (his mentor). In fact, he says that poetry "is not an aesthetic category" ("The Age of the Poets," p. 3); rather, it is a form of thinking without predication, as when Mallarmé, in a famous letter from 1867, describes his intellectual "crisis" as a self-annihilating experience in which "My thought has thought itself through and reached a pure idea": namely, the idea of nothingness, le Néant (Mallarmé, p. 93).[4] Whereas traditional philosophy has "sutured" itself to science and politics, poetry is pure thinking -- "a form of thinking without knowledge, or even: a properly incalculable thought" ("What Does the Poem Think?" [1992], p. 33).

The suspicion that Heidegger has had a hand in shaping Badiou's position is confirmed by his essay on "The Philosophical Status of the Poem after Heidegger" (1992), where poetry is said to free thinking from the logic of propositions in which words are mere "terms" of designation in representational-calculative thinking. As Heidegger says in Was Heisst Denken? (1954), "Thinking has this enigmatic property, that it itself is brought to its own light -- though only if and only as long as it is thinking, and keeps clear of persisting in ratiocination about ratio."[5] Thinking is, in this respect, untheorizable. It is not made of concepts but, like poetry, is made of words, where words are rather more sounds than signs or instruments of nomination, assertion, and representation. Thinking is less an act than a responsibility or responsiveness to what calls for it, namely (like Augustine's time) that which resists the grasp of concepts, as if thinking were drawn before anything else toward the unthinkable.

In any event, Badiou's paradoxical position in "What Does the Poem Think?" is that "the poem is an unthinkable thought" (p. 48) -- for example, "the pure notion of 'there is,' in the very effacement of its empirical objectivity" (p. 51). Recall Emmanuel Levinas on the "there is" (il y a), existence without existents: "There is, in general, without it mattering what there is, without our being able to fix a substantive to this term. There is is an impersonal form, as in it rains, or it is warm. Its anonymity is essential."[6] As the il y a is not anything that is, so poetic thinking is, like Mallarmé's poem, autonomous, as if one could say that thinking is purely intransitive: it thinks.

Which is all very well, until one realizes that Badiou seems impatient with his own paradoxes, as when, in "The Age of the Poets," he extracts from poetry "certain maxims of thought" -- for example: "Rimbaud . . . declares the expiration of the cogito as the investigation of all possible thought" (p. 6). Or, again, when he cites the Portuguese poet, Fernando Pessoa (writing under one of his heteronyms, Álvaro de Campos): "it is indispensable to think of nothing" --

To think about nothing

Is to fully possess the soul.

To think about nothing

Is to intimately live

Life's ebb and flow.[7]

If Badiou's thesis is that "the age of the poets animates a polemic against meaning" (p. 16), he nevertheless finds such transparent assertions convenient to his purpose. Likewise in "Poetry and Communism" (a 2014 lecture at the Sorbonne published here for the first time), poetry is not "thinking about nothing" but engagement in Sartre's sense (particularly in its celebration of the Spanish Civil War):

These poems tell us that the communist idea is the compassion for the simple life of the people afflicted by inequality and injustice -- that it is the broad vision of a raising up, both in thought and in practice, which is opposed to resignation and changes it into a patient heroism (p. 107).

No doubt it's unreasonable to require occasional writings (spanning nearly a half-century) to fit together like the consecutive integers of an argument. Dialecticians, after all, have always bent the law of non-contradiction. For example, in "The Autonomy of the Aesthetic Process" (1966), Badiou remarks upon "the ambiguity of the critical task of socialist realism," which "consists in determining the ideological existence of the artworks, by producing the concepts of their historical belonging. But it also consists in unveiling the theoretical existence that marks the singularity of the 'great works'" (p. 114). In this event the social realist "will use neither the scientific concepts used to describe the historical process, nor ideological concepts. It will require new concepts which can register the literariness of the text" (p. 116).

And where are these "new concepts" to be found except in the writings of poets and artists themselves? Mallarmé is Badiou's exemplar, but one could start with the early German Romantics, who invented the notion of poetry as such: poetry that is no longer in the service of the Church, the State, and the School, nor of anything outside of the words of which it is made. Hence Friedrich Schlegel (1772-1829) in one of his "Athenaeum Fragments": "The romantic kind of poetry is the only one that is more than a kind, that is, as it were, poetry itself" (#116).[8]

Perhaps one could think of Badiou as one of "the last romantics" whose socialist realism divides him against himself (think of Rimbaud's famous motto: Je est un autre). In "What Does Literature Think?" (2005), he states the realist's position that the "idea that literature thinks . . . can only mean that it opens up the realm of the particular" (p. 133), but his model is nevertheless "Flaubert's prose, which, thanks to its style (a crucial operation in literature), the author intended to exist in its own right, with no imaginary referent in the world" (p. 135). (Recall Flaubert's dream of writing

a book about nothing, a book dependent on nothing external, which would be held together by the strength of its style, just as the earth, suspended in the void, depends on nothing for its support; a book that would have almost no subject, or at least in which the subject would be almost invisible, if such a thing is possible.)[9]

So perhaps it is not surprising that Badiou devotes much of the second half of his book to readings of leftist novelists like Natacha Michel, whose work is "sensible and formal at the same time," bewitching philosophy "to the point where meaning is capable of doing without the concept," and who "holds fast to the literary montage of machines, or even of machinations, whose formal autonomy is apt to open up and capture -- without submitting to -- the source of some meaning" (p. 155).

Likewise, in "Void, Series, Clearing: Essay on the Prose of Severo Sarduy" (2000), Badiou admires Sarduy's indifference to "everything that could be recognized as agreeable form, or as form whose labour of recognition we could do without so as to go straight to whatever sensible signification it organizes" (p. 184). And in his final essay, "Pierre Guyotat, Prince of Prose" (2015), Badiou engages the notorious author of Éden, Éden, Éden, banned in 1970 (in France!) for its seemingly endless stream of sexual and scatological imagery, but which Badiou admires for its extravagant phrasing -- the heaping up of often bizarre nouns and verbs linked by innumerable commas and semicolons before terminating arbitrarily in a period.[10]

Whether the texts of these authors can be counted as examples of "what literature thinks" is not always clear, unless what calls for thinking is simply "the word as such," the word left unaddressed by logic, linguistics, and philosophy of language -- what Marjorie Perloff, writing on the Russian Futurists, calls "the word set free" from everything except its own material disposition on the page.[11]

As if language remained philosophy's "unthinkable thought."

[1] See Badiou's reading of Mallarmé's Un Coup de dés in his Being and Event (1988), trans. Oliver Feltham (London: Bloomsbury, 2015), pp. 201-8.

[2] "Crisis of Verse," Mallarmé: Selected Prose Poems, Essays, and Letters, trans. Bradford Cook (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1956), pp. 40-41. Compare Heidegger on the autonomy of words: "The poet must renounce having words under his control" "Words" (1958), On the Way to Language, trans. Peter D. Hertz (New York: Harper & Row, 1971), p. 147.

[3] What is Literature? (New York: The Citadel Press, 1962), p. 12.

[4] Mallarmé knew his Hegel, for whom beauty, conceived as an absolute, cannot be the object of any predication: the "absolute," as he wrote in his Encyclopedia of Philosophy, "negates all things that are not absolute. It is their nothing or negativity. The absolute pervades all finite and definite positions, ruling out the metaphysical value of all positivisms, and thereby affirming its sovereign freedom. It is unutterable, unpredictable." Trans. Gustav Emil Meuller (New York: Philosophical Library, 1959), p. 103.

[5] What is Called Thinking? Trans. J. Glenn Gray (New York: Harper & Row, 1968), p. 28.

[6] Existence and Existents (1947), trans. Alphonso Lingis (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995), p. 58.

[7] "I've been thinking about nothing at all," Fernando Pessoa and Co.: Selected Poems, trans Richard Zenith (New York: Grove Press, 1998), p. 201.

[8] Schlegel, Philosophical Fragments. Trans. Peter Firchow (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1991), p. 32.

[9] The Selected Letters of Gustave Flaubert, trans. Francis Steegmuller (New York: Vintage Books, 1953), p. 128. Interestingly, in this same letter Flaubert says that "there are in me . . . two distinct persons": the anatomist who dissects Emma Bovary and her world, and the formalist for whom le mot juste is a thing in its own right and not simply an exact designation.

[10] See Diarmuid Hester, "Revisiting Pierre Guyotat's Éden, Éden, Éden: Splanchnology, Writing, Matter, and the Devastation of Ethics," French Forum, 40.1 (2015): 31-45. Splanchnology is the study of the visceral, reproductive, and digestive organs. See also Stuart Kendall's review of Catherine Brun's biography of Guyotat in SubStance, 34.3 (2005): 136-39, esp. 138:

Guyotat's writing performs a structural deformation of French grammar and orthography, most obvious in the omission of silent letters and syllables, but also in a reworking of the rules and words of action and possession. He invigorates language through invention, forcing verbs from nouns, and through recourse to a vast number of neologisms.

[11] "The Word Set Free: Text and Image in the Russian Futurist Book," The Futurist Moment: Avant-Garde, Avant-Guerre, and the Language of Rupture (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1986), pp. 131-60.