The Aim of Belief

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Timothy Chan (ed.), The Aim of Belief, Oxford University Press, 2013, 233pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199672134.

Reviewed by Nikolaj Nottelmann, University of Southern Denmark


This collection of newly commissioned contributions to the complex debates over "the aim of belief" bolster Bertrand Russell's famous remark that "on the view we take of belief our philosophical outlook largely depends"[1]: Few other philosophical subjects in current favor seem to set in simultaneous motion so many concepts at once central and controversial. Not only the much disputed concepts of belief and truth, but also knowledge, inquiry, rationality, normativity, semantic content, justification, and intentionality. I shall begin with presenting some fairly undisputed common ground between the debaters (even if truly uncontroversial claims are hard to come by in this terrain).

First it is hard to deny that the attitude of belief is somehow tied closer to the notion of truth than are attitudes such as desire or supposition. Also it seems hard to deny that at least in some modest sense some ties between belief and truth appear normative: e.g., if under normal circumstances I believe that the grass is green, it seems at least appropriate to ask for my reasons indicating that the grass is in fact green. In contrast, uncontroversially neither desires -- nor suppositions -- standardly mandate similar questions, even when their contents are false. This is one of several ways in which one may begin to unpack Bernard William's fertile metaphor that -- unlike desires and suppositions -- "beliefs aim at the truth",[2] and is also a way in which one may try to develop John Searle's famous notion that beliefs have "mind-to-world direction of fit"[3]. In some sense, at least typically our beliefs are meant to fit the facts.

The chapters collected by Timothy Chan share a common commitment to investigating the philosophical basis for tentative claims like the above, scrutinizing whether they still carry conviction once they are clearly phrased and thoroughly examined. Central questions include:

  1. How exactly are we to understand the truth-norms (if any) according to which beliefs and belief-formations are appropriately guided and/or evaluated?
  2. If such truth-norms apply, do they apply specifically and fundamentally to belief, or are they merely instances of other norms, e.g., general ethical norms?
  3. If truth-norms apply to beliefs, do they apply as a matter of conceptual necessity; or perhaps even as a matter of metaphysical necessity, by virtue of the very essence of belief?

In addition, a host of related matters is insightfully discussed by the various authors, including the questions of whether knowledge-norms are more fundamental than truth-norms, how justification-norms and evidentialist norms connect with truth-norms, and whether a modest version of doxastic voluntarism proves defensible. For lack of space below I shall bracket those interesting topics in order to concentrate on the central issues.

Overall the volume is of a consistently high quality. Considered individually, each chapter is enjoyable in terms of originality, intellectual vigor, and editorial finish. Together the chapters represent an impressive collection of new contributions by many of the most prolific authors working in the aim-of-belief field, further refining and expanding the relevant debates. Chan's introduction (Chapter 1) is instructive and helpful, even if it would have benefited the reader had he further discussed the crucial implicit background assumptions of the various debates. I shall now turn to making explicit at least three of those.

First, all contributions seem to take for granted that generally beliefs have truth-evaluable contents. However, e.g., Robert Audi has maintained that sometimes appropriate belief ascriptions are grounded merely in behavioral responses to the discrimination of relevant properties, as when on a hike I shift my footing in response to the feel of a jagged rock without the need for an intervening conceptual representation of it[4]. Recently, Daniel Hutto has even argued that the psychologically most basic type of belief, shared by many sophisticated animals including humans, lack truth-evaluable content[5]. Interestingly, this position could be upheld without giving up a basic commitment to representationalism, the view that believing involves representing the world as being one way or other: maps are paradigmatic representations, yet arguably they are not true or false, only more or less accurate. And perhaps, as Frank Ramsey once had it, our beliefs are indeed maps by which we steer[6].

Another shared assumption seems to be an implicit focus on consciously held beliefs, not least those resulting from conscious inquiry. For example, much is made of the unbelievability of "blind-spot" propositions such as <It is raining and I do not believe it is raining>. If this is true, consciously aiming to settle whether it is puts you in a pernicious pinch. Krister Bykvist and Anandi Hattiangadi (Chapter 6) specifically examine the nature of this pinch as well as its wider normative implications. However, such self-referential propositions are not obviously unbelievable, once we allow for unconsciously held beliefs: arguably a racist may easily believe that she has no racist beliefs, even if unconsciously she is deeply committed to a variety of blatantly racist propositions.[7] What perhaps she cannot do is sustain this belief while consciously acknowledging her commitments to racist propositions, as well as to their logical implications. Pascal Engel (Chapter 3) is admirably explicit that "the norm of truth" as he conceives it guides "the kind of conscious reasoning in which we engage when we ask ourselves whether P is true" (p. 56). Arguably at other places the volume would have benefited from keeping separate to a larger extent discussion of the norms governing (possibly non-conscious[8]) belief-states, from discussion of the norms governing belief-forming processes such as conscious inquiry.

The final assumption I wish to make explicit is perhaps the most subtle and far-reaching. Whereas the first two only limit the discussions in scope from what one might be led to expect from the unqualified "aim of belief" heading, this third assumption lies at the very heart of the normative debate even within those restrictions: that the truth-aim may be captured in first-order propositional logic as a material implication between the propositions <p> and <Bp>, e.g., in the form of falsehood-avoidance ( Bp  p) or in a striving for propositional omniscience ( p ⇒ Bp). This is common ground among those who think that falsehood-avoidance is merely something we ought to want (Paul Horwich, Chapter 2), those who consider it belief's metaphysically constitutive norm of correctness (Ralph Wedgwood, Chapter 7), and those who think no such norms universally apply (David Papineau, Chapter 4). The assumption, however, is far from innocent. Consider, e.g., that one way to honor such a falsehood-avoidance norm is being served by a godlike mind-reader, who ensures that whatever belief one forms about a relevant domain comes out true, but only because the mind-reader changes the world if necessary so as to fit the belief. That this "world-to-mind-fit" falsehood-avoidance strategy is not disallowed by the material truth-norm seems blatantly to flout the basic idea that fundamental truth-norms must flow from belief's mind-to-world direction of fit.

One might think that the problem is quickly solved, if instead of falsehood-avoidance one makes ignorance-avoidance the basic norm (BpKp). After all, arguably the godlike mind-reader's assistance fails to ensure knowledge, even if it ensures true belief. But first, as Daniel Whiting argues at length (Chapter 10), knowledge-norms for belief are controversial. And second, even if the godlike mind-reader should also ensure that ignorance-avoidance is satisfied by automatically providing the agent with sufficient evidence that the world has indeed changed to align with her spurious beliefs, the situation still seems to contravene the spirit of mind-to-world direction of fit. Suffice it to say the following here: nothing obviously suggests that truth-norms should be captured by way of mere material implications, rather than by more substantial relations such as truth-making or causality. Simply taking this for granted seems too quick.[9]

I shall now discuss how the contributors to this volume stand with regard to the basic questions (1)-(3) from above, as conceived within the explicated basic restrictions. Arguably, more precisely, the key question comes to this: which first-order logical relations between <p> and <Bp> normatively govern conscious truth-evaluable belief (paradigmatically, beliefs resulting from conscious inquiry into the semantic value of their propositional content)? Let us begin with what is perhaps the most uncompromising view: Wedgwood argues that truth is the essential or constitutive norm of belief. In his preferred phrasing, a belief is correct if and only if the proposition believed is true. In other words, a believer only believes in the correct way if she entirely satisfies the falsehood-avoidance norm (Bp ⇒ p). On this view, not only is the falsehood-avoidance norm sui generisit also applies to all actual belief-states (at least the truth-evaluable ones) with metaphysical necessity. Whiting wholeheartedly supports Wedgwood's "truth view", but largely leaves metaphysical issues aside. Engel also explicitly brackets Wedgwood's metaphysical claims, but stands in basic agreement regarding the form, fundamentality, and universality of the norm: "When our beliefs are false . . . they are incorrect and in need of correction" (p. 33).

This is a radical verdict. It is worth considering two types of cases: highly beneficial false beliefs and very well-grounded false beliefs in skeptical scenarios. The first kind of case is exemplified by a victim of heinous violence, who, after reconstructive surgery and intense psychotherapy, manages to believe that her face is still fairly attractive. This belief, even if false, surely is beneficial to her quality of life and seems to harm no one. The second kind of case is exemplified by the customary envatted brain, which believes on the basis of a lifetime of experiences that it lives in Paris, even though actually it is situated in a Martian laboratory. In both cases it seems at least somewhat strange to claim that the false beliefs "stand in need of correction"; in the first case, because correcting the hard-won error would seem downright cruel, and in the second case, because the brain's error seems perfectly rational, whereas the truth would seem literally unbelievable to it. Perhaps a bit surprisingly, discussions of such cases do not loom large in the volume. Papineau, as well as Jonathan Adler and Michael Hicks (Chapter 8), consider pragmatic objections to universal falsehood-avoidance at length, though, but with very different conclusions: whereas Papineau concludes that "there are cases where there is nothing at all wrong with believing falsely" (p. 68), Adler and Hicks only concede that sometimes non-epistemic reasons may commit us to believing falsely, even if such beliefs must remain unreasonable, and thus incorrect (p. 165).

Various elements of Wedgwood's thesis are rejected by the other contributors. Horwich argues that the fundamental truth-norm does not concern belief directly, but rather what we ought to want for our beliefs. Papineau drastically rejects the idea of sui generis belief-related norms altogether, arguing that any link between truth and belief is merely one of contingent biological design. Kathrin Glüer and Åsa Wikforss (Chapter 5) also construe the link between epistemic rationality and belief purely descriptively, but unlike Papineau they agree with Wedgwood that the link is metaphysically constitutive. Bykvist and Hattiangadi argue that considerations of the above-mentioned "blind-spot propositions" drastically undermine the view that truth-norms universally apply. Adler and Hicks stand in fundamental agreement with Wedgwood concerning the truth-norm, defending it against pragmatist objections. They even strengthen it to require knowledge in the sense of truth established by evidence: "Epistemically speaking, one correctly believes (asserts) that p, only if[10] one's evidence or reasons establish, or one knows, that p" (p. 140). However they construe this as a conceptual rather than a metaphysical truth: "The concept of belief determines its own ethic" (p. 165). Asbjørn Steglich-Petersen (Chapter 11) argues in a similar vein that the fundamental truth-norm concerns reasons establishing truth, but takes this to concern the constitutive goal of justificatory processes, rather than an essential normative feature of belief. Andrew Reisner (Chapter 9) on the other hand mounts a strong challenge to evidentialism, arguing that at least in some exotic cases belief entirely without evidential grounding is perfectly permissible.

The volume is highly recommended to the professional philosopher in search of the state-of-the-art within the specific aim-of-belief debates, as they have progressed over the last decades in various specialized journals. Readers interested in wider issues concerning doxastic ethics and epistemic rationality will find patient reading rewarded with a host of valuable arguments and acute observations bearing on those concerns. Researchers entering the field of belief metaphysics through psychology or cognitive science, however, will most likely find this collection too oblivious to belief's wider role in human and animal cognitive economies. The less advanced philosophy student or layman is bound to be unnerved by the kaleidoscopic complexity and dizzying abstractness of the debates. Despite what its back cover blurb might suggest, this is a specialist volume. By all relevant standards, though, it is a fine one.

[1] B. Russell, The Analysis of Mind (London: George Allen & Unwin, 1921): 231.

[2] B. Williams, "Deciding to Believe", in: Problems of the Self (Cambrige: Cambridge University Press, 1973): 148.

[3] See in particular J.R. Searle, Expression and Meaning: Cambridge University Press, 1979).

[4] R. Audi, "Belief: A Study of Form, Content, and Reference", in: N. Nottelmann (ed.): New Essays on Belief: Constitution, Content, and Structure (Houndmills: Palgrave Macmillan, 2013): 33.

[5] D. D. Hutto, "Why Believe in Contentless Beliefs?", in: N. Nottelmann (ed.): New Essays on Belief. Constitution, Content, and Structure (Houndmills: Palgrave Macmillan, 2013).

[6] F. P. Ramsey, Foundations: Essays in Philosophy, Logic, Mathematics, and Economics (London: Routledge & Henley, 1978): 134.

[7] I assume here that one may, by virtue of one's general behavior and reasoning, qualify as a racist believer, even if one does not recognize oneself as one. It is also assumed that belief ascription is closed under conjunction.

[8] The minority view that all beliefs are conscious has been defended by a few philosophers, perhaps most famously by R. B. Braithwaite, "The Nature of Believing", in P. A. Griffiths, P.A. (ed.), Knowledge and Belief (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1967).

[9] An idea worth investigating might be this: the fundamental constitutive aim of inquiry is not mere true belief, but discovery (in the sense of true beliefs, whose contents are made-true by the world prior to belief-formation). At the very least this idea would explain why it seems so weird to recommend any doxastic attitude towards the above-mentioned "blind-spot propositions"; the problem is not that those propositions are unbelievables (which arguably they are not), but rather that they are undiscoverables, hence exempt from the basic discovery norm. For lack of space I cannot pursue this idea further here.

[10] At this place Wedgwood and Engel have "if and only if". This important weakening is not explicitly discussed by Adler and Hicks, though. And the further quotation given above seems naturally to afford a stronger reader.