The Allure of Things: Process and Object in Contemporary Philosophy

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Roland Faber and Andrew Goffey (eds.), The Allure of Things: Process and Object in Contemporary Philosophy, Bloomsbury, 2014, 251pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472525208.

Reviewed by Vincent Colapietro, Pennsylvania State University


This collection grew out of a conference held in December 2010 (Metaphysics and Things: New Forms of Speculative Thought) at Claremont College, under the auspices of the Whitehead Research Project (WRP). The conference was one in an ongoing series designed to provide opportunities to exhibit the contemporary relevance of the Whiteheadian approach,[1] by encouraging (in Whitehead's words) "an active novelty of fundamental ideas illuminating the social system" (Modes of Thought, p. 174; quoted by Roland Faber in his Preface, ix).[2] Without theoretical innovation, society would allegedly suffer a "slow descent of accepted thought": the dead weight of inert ideas[3] would insure decline, not simply stasis. From Whitehead's perspective, then, the dramatic ascent of novel thought, the transformative power of a truly contemporaneous conceptuality, demands adventurous thinkers, ones willing to take up anew the task of thinking. More than anything else, such thinking should focus on fundamentals, what is most basic or pervasive.

Hence, exegesis must give way to experimentation, unimaginative expositors to creative thinkers, though experimentation can take the form of a distinctive genre of philosophical exegesis (a form illustrated, say, by Deleuze in his book on Spinoza or Isabelle Stengers in hers on Whitehead). Such thinkers, however much they are informed by the writings of others and even committed to the animating impulses of inherited systems, are in the arduous business of crafting new concepts (see, e.g., Deleuze and Guattari, What is Philosophy?). As Deleuze, Stengers, and others show in exemplary fashion, writing about a thinker can involve truly thinking with and against that thinker. For such interpreters of Whitehead as Stengers, Roland Faber, and most (if not all) contributors to this volume, philosophy is, as Deleuze and Guattari contend, "the art of forming, inventing, and fabricating concepts" (What Is Philosophy?, 2). In any event, The Allure of Things is intended to exemplify nothing less than what Whitehead means by the adventure of ideas and what Deleuze and Guattari understand by philosophy (the art of crafting concepts responsive to the exigencies of one's own time).

The study of Whitehead, as much as that of any other thinker, perhaps even more than most, has suffered from a kind of scholasticism (expositions taking the form of a highly technical but largely insular discourse, ones in which fundamental assumptions are all too often taken for granted and alternative approaches are in equal measure given only cursory consideration). Whitehead might have in some measure, however small, encouraged this tendency. "The progress of philosophy does not primarily involve," he insists, "reactions of agreement or dissent." Rather such progress "essentially consists in the enlargement of thought, whereby contradictions and agreements are transformed into practical aspects of wider points of view." Whitehead offers this as a justification for not answering in detail his critics.

But philosophical articulation, as John E. Smith insists,

is inescapably dialectical in the precise sense that it requires a critical arena of discussion within which it is possible to determine how much a proposed categorical scheme can actually interpret in comparison with alternative schemes of the same logical type of articulation" ("Being, Immediacy, and Articulation," 1971, 609-10; emphasis added).

But such comparisons are all too infrequently carried out in the depth and detail required to advance the work of philosophy, for (as Smith notes) "the discussion does not advance to the level where comparison between actual philosophical proposals is possible because all the effort is going into determining the entrance requirements" (610). Such critical comparison is however the explicit aim of The Allure of Things. But, here as elsewhere, it is critical to resist taking the will for the deed.

The will here is indeed explicit. Although the editors say the volume is organized around a comparison between process and object-oriented philosophy,[4] they are not accurate. They should not have allowed the inaugural aim of the conference to govern the eventual shape of the collection. While the topic of how to conceive the relationship between processes and things is one of the main concerns of some of the contributors, the speculative turn in contemporary thought to which these contributors bear witness is much wider than a dialectical comparison between process and objected-oriented approaches. Individuation, facts, and the task of metaphysics itself are topics explored with little or no attention to the alternatives identified in the book's subtitle.

In the case of Graham Harman ("Another Response to Shaviro"),[5] there is, however, an utterly apt irony, since Harman's object-oriented philosophy (OOP) or, now more commonly, object-oriented ontology (OOO) revolves around the thesis that objects do not directly interact with one another but rather do so only vicariously (the being of objects is alleged to be bound up with their tendency to withdraw from one another into the inaccessible depths of their own interiority). Harman is in effect impersonating the objects celebrated in his ontology: he is withdrawing into himself, only superficially engaging those who argue from alternative approaches to the defining questions of speculative philosophy (above all, Whitehead and his contemporary advocates).

In contrast to Harman, Faber has unquestionably taken his participation to be an opportunity to probe the surprising affinities between Whitehead and Harman, and also their irreducible differences. Faber adheres most closely to the overarching objective (at least, the explicit objective) of the collection. Quite apart from this, his is an extremely suggestive, speculatively audacious piece. In the contributions by James J. Bono and especially Levi R. Bryant, we have, from the perspective of an object-oriented approach, serious, detailed, and indeed illuminating engagements with the Whiteheadian version of process thought. In my judgment, Bryant's essay realizes the announced aim of these diverse essays more fully than any other. Moreover, his use of Derrida displays the power and fecundity of a philosopher's writings that are even now all too often maligned.

Like other contributors, Stengers draws heavily upon Deleuze. In particular, she experiments with his conception of the art of dramatization, that is, the process whereby "thinking is produced under the imperative of an Idea whose primary power is to dissolve any stable representation, any consensual reference" (189). The creation of concepts is an instance of co-creation, the question being as generative of the identity of the thinker as the thinker is creative in fabricating a response. In her judgment, things or objects lack the power "to orient their own dramatization" (191). The same is not true of "the question of the creation of 'rapport'" (194). At base, this word signifies "the relation which matters." From this deceptively simple characterization, Stengers unfolds a stunningly brilliant set of insights into truly fundamental facets of human experience and the world disclosed in and through such experience. Even so, she readily admits,

my encounter with the OOO is probably marked by a lack of affinity. As a result, the thread of affinity I am pursuing -- thinking with Deleuze and Latour as a line of escape from [what OOO authors identify as] correlationism -- will be felt as an evasion of 'the' question by those who take it as "the" challenge. (193)

That challenge is that Whitehead and other process philosophers have failed to do justice to things, to give an either experientially or theoretically adequate account of objects.

I would, however, be unfair to the book if I simply left the impression that it is little more than a missed opportunity, an occasion when a respectful yet critical exchange between champions of process metaphysics and those of "speculative realism" mostly failed to occur. Such an exchange did occur, although not as fully as one (at least, as I) would have desired. Of far greater importance, however, the essays do address central questions in an illuminating manner. Moreover, they do so in such a way that, for the most part, renders readily apparent their implications for ascertaining the complex relationship between process thought and object-oriented philosophy. Accordingly, much is to be learned from them, indeed much bearing directly upon the topics to which Whitehead, Harman, and those rival traditions flowing from their suggestive writings.

The essays are, without exception, finely crafted, unquestionably erudite, and philosophically engaging attempts to think through fundamental questions, more often than not by thinking with and against little more than a handful of historically influential thinkers (most prominently, Whitehead and Deleuze). In the compass of this review, it is impossible to do justice to the individual contributors (an informative, succinct summation of each chapter is provided in the Introduction by Goffey (5-10))

The allure of things is itself simultaneously an indisputable facet of our experience of them and, as this experience so forcefully attests, an inherent capacity of those things themselves. They arrest and hold our attention, invite and sustain our queries. The accounts of this and other features of things, especially as defended by Whitehead, Harman, Faber, Stengers, and others, is indicative of the irrepressible drive of the human animal to make fuller and finer sense out of (at the very least) the objects around which our lives, thoughts, and theories turn. Whitehead deeply admired William James, his predecessor at Harvard, and did not hesitate to call him that adorable genius"). James judged the universe to be wild, as wild as a hawk's wing. If this is so, can a faithful account of the cosmos fail to be a wild one, can it be anything other than a vision in which the jaggedness, adventure, and hence drama of thought is, to some extent, an enactment of a world in the making, one shot through with suspense, upheaval, and metamorphosis? And if this is so, can essays such as those assembled here be more fairly judged than as just that -- essays, that is, attempts and, in particular, ones designed to take seriously the historicity, adventure, and drama so intimately interwoven into the very fabric of things? The method of dramatization, that of seeing concepts themselves bound up with personae, seems ideally suited to essay in any attempt to do justice to these features of things.

Even when these contributions are taken as essays, we are entitled to press a number of points, not least of all the one with which I will conclude. We are still in the thrall of Kant insofar as meta-theoretical reflections on the very possibility of thinking -- more precisely, thinking in a novel manner, one demanded by the social upheavals, scientific revolutions, and other developments defining the historical present -- are allowed to shoulder off the stage theoretical engagement in the actuality of thought, as it is contemporaneously unfolding, indeed, as it is urgently needed to make sense out of our lives and world. At its best, The Allure of Things exemplifies nothing less than such an engagement. At its worst, it celebrates the possibility of thinking by offering painstaking expositions of authors who by now are rather familiar personae in the contemporary adventure of philosophical ideas, thereby postponing the very activity being celebrated. The slow descent resulting from the dead weight of merely inherited ideas is, however, more than compensated here by the dramatic ascent of novel ideas. In sum, what this volume lacks in coherence is more than balanced by what it offers in vitality: traditional questions are addressed in a truly innovative manner and novel ones posed in a very promising way. Accordingly, those interested in the "speculative turn" in contemporary thought have, in this volume, essayists worthy of thinking with and against.

[1] It is only appropriate for me to disclose that I have been a participant in several of these conferences.

[2] It is unclear whether the referent here is simply human society or something much more inclusive, for example, the nexus of things, human and otherwise, growing together but in doing so also establishing their individuality. While Whitehead likely intends the narrower meaning in this passage, the contributors to The Allure of Things seem committed to exploring the extent to which the broader sense can in general be traced to his speculative endeavors.

[3] In the context of education, Whitehead schools tend to be "overladen with inert ideas. Education with inert ideas is not only useless; it is, above all things, harmful -- Corruptio, optimi pessima" (The Aims of Education, 13). Such ideas are however harmful in, at least, all fields of theoretical endeavor.

[4] Advocates of OOO are, at the very least, united in their rejection of correlationism. In After Finitude (Continuum, 2008), Quentin Meillassoux defines this as "the idea according to which we only ever have access to the correlation between thinking and being, and never to either term considered apart from the other" (5). For these advocates, it is not only possible to conceive objects apart from subjects, thought, language, and other correlates. It is necessary, precisely, to do justice to the allure of things (the allure things exert on one another, not simply on sentient or rational subjects).

[5] There is something odd here, since Harman's essay is a response to one not included in this volume, though presented at the conference (Steven Shaviro's "The Consequences of Panpsychism"). Shaviro's essay is available online.