The Ambitions of Curiosity: Understanding the World in Ancient Greece and China

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Lloyd, G.E.R., The Ambitions of Curiosity: Understanding the World in Ancient Greece and China, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 188pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521894611.

Reviewed by Eric Hutton, University of Utah


In the late 1980’s, the well-known scholar of ancient Greek science G.E.R. Lloyd took up an interest in comparing the development of science in early China and early Greece. The Ambitions of Curiosity is the third book in Cambridge UP’s “Ideas in Context” series in which he pursues this research program, which was first announced in his Demystifying Mentalities (Cambridge UP, 1990) and then expanded in Adversaries and Authorities (Cambridge UP, 1996). Because of its subject matter and comparative approach, The Ambitions of Curiosity and its predecessors merit the attention of anyone interested in the history and philosophy of science, early Greece, early China, and comparative studies of intellectual history in general. Readers attracted to these topics and Lloyd’s particular approach to them will also want to consult the volume he has recently co-authored with Nathan Sivin, The Way and the Word (Yale UP, 2002), which likewise compares ancient Greek and Chinese medicine and science.

Lloyd has three main aims in writing on these topics. One aim is to challenge certain stereotypes about Greece and China by showing that they are neither as different nor as similar as some have claimed. A second, more important aim is to illustrate how scientific ideas developed differently in the two cultures, and in particular to show how different social and political settings influenced the methods of investigation and results of inquiry. For a few decades now, there has been growing acceptance of the idea that the history of science has been shaped by social and political factors, so Lloyd’s work is not new or revealing in that regard. Rather, his point is that we can only appreciate exactly how much these non-scientific factors affected the development of science when we compare different traditions in order to appreciate better the peculiarities of each.

Thirdly, Lloyd aims to promote a particular method of comparative study, one focusing on the categories used by the “actors” themselves, i.e. the ancients, rather than those used by the “observers,” i.e. modern scholars (cf. Ambitions p. 45). His point is that if we start out with some pre-conceived notion of, say, astronomy, and then go hunting through the ancient texts looking to see how they do “astronomy” as understood by us, we will likely wind up disappointed, since much of what the ancients did would not qualify as “astronomy” in our sense (or even as “science,” in our sense), and moreover we will have failed to grasp how they understood their own projects. Instead, we need to start by paying careful attention to how they themselves describe their investigations and how they relate them to each other. Only then can we adequately appreciate how their respective scientific traditions developed differently. In applying this method, Lloyd admirably avoids taking the extreme and unreasonable step of disowning the modern categories altogether, for without some general categories under which the Chinese and Greeks can be seen as investigating the “same” subject material, no comparison would be possible at all. The modern categories remain in Lloyd’s approach as thin labels (e.g. “astronomy” understood broadly as “study of the heavens”) that serve as points by which to give some initial orientation to our study of the materials.

In The Ambitions of Curiosity, Lloyd pursues the above three aims through an examination of “systematic inquiry” in the Chinese and Greek traditions. Lloyd explicitly eschews giving a definition of this term at the outset, preferring instead to let it emerge from the studies that make up the bulk of his text, but he seems to have in mind something like a notion of “research,” where this involves careful and sustained investigation aimed at producing solutions to some set of questions or concerns faced by the investigators. Lloyd does not limit himself here to specifically “scientific” investigation, since he wants to see how the various fields of investigation came to define themselves and be recognized as distinct areas for inquiry, which would be obscured if we started by dividing the objects of inquiry into discrete fields.

The breadth of Lloyd’s conception of “systematic inquiry” is shown by the range of topics he covers over the course of the book. Chapter one compares the rise of historiography in Greece and China. Chapter two focuses on how interests in predicting the future or divining unseen facts helped the development of astronomy and medicine in China, Mesopotamia, and Greece. Chapter three examines how Chinese and Greek thinkers both showed an interest in numbers, though in quite different ways. In a particularly noteworthy section, Lloyd points out that stereotypes of the Chinese as interested in numbers primarily for their practical application, and not out of any more purely theoretical interests, are simply false (p. 62-63). Chapter four compares Greek and Chinese innovations in warfare, agriculture, and civil engineering. Here, as a point complementing his attack on stereotypes about the Chinese in the previous chapter, Lloyd shows how the Greeks were not engaged solely in abstract theorizing, but were also very interested in practical applications. Chapter five examines the development of technical language in the two traditions, with particular regard to terms in mathematics, medicine, and botany (especially plants with pharmacological properties). In the sixth and final chapter he sums up the results of the preceding studies and draws general comparative conclusions about the development of systematic inquiry in ancient times.

Since the last chapter is, in a sense, the heart of Lloyd’s enterprise, in describing and evaluating the book it is perhaps best to concentrate on that chapter. There, Lloyd focuses on the way institutional frameworks, most specifically state support, contributed to or impeded various forms of systematic inquiry. As he points out, no simple and reductive conclusions can be drawn about the matter. From the studies of the first five chapters, it is clear that state support or lack thereof neither systematically spurred nor inhibited successful inquiry in either culture. Nevertheless, in Lloyd’s view certain overall trends due to institutional differences can still be discerned as follows.

In China, much systematic inquiry was conducted for the sake of the Emperor and was supported by the state. Such support paved the way for striking successes in some cases, and the centralization of power also made it possible that discoveries could be widely disseminated and implemented. However, this institutional framework also meant that the investigators needed to be careful about the results they presented, lest they lose their means of livelihood—or even their heads. Moreover, the fact that much systematic inquiry was funded by the state probably contributed to a certain kind of consensus among Chinese thinkers. For instance, while Chinese cosmologists may have disagreed about certain particulars, their works show a striking similarity in articulating a system in which the ruler is responsible for ensuring harmony in nature and among humans. Lloyd suggests that such convergence seems more than coincidental when one notices that such systems highlight how the ruler must depend upon his subordinates—including precisely the cosmologists writing these works in the state’s employ—in order for the world to be well ordered (p. 138-139).

By contrast, in Greece there was no centralized ruling power, and most investigators worked without state support. While some of them may have been independently wealthy, most would have had to teach for a living, which meant that they would have to compete with each other for students. According to Lloyd, this factor promoted a greater diversity of views, since one way of distinguishing oneself from the competition was to come up with unique, daring, even extravagant ideas and approaches and then claim that one’s rivals were inferior in terms of veracity, accuracy, effectiveness, and so on. At the same time, the lack of a strong, centralized state authority to support inquiry and disseminate its results meant that discoveries frequently benefited only a few, and were sometimes lost to the public altogether.

The preceding summary cannot do full justice to the nuance of Lloyd’s work. Any book surveying such a broad range of texts, topics, and times must inevitably generalize, and for almost any generalization there are exceptions. Lloyd is usually sensitive to such exceptions and takes care not to overstate his case, which is one of the virtues of his work. Even so, there are still certain points on which one might seriously challenge his contentions in Ambitions. Given the vast amount of material Lloyd surveys, it is impossible to discuss all the places where one might disagree with his generalizations, so I will focus on a few select claims he makes about the Chinese tradition, since that is where Lloyd’s analysis seems more problematic, and where the majority of Western readers are less likely to be familiar enough with the sources to evaluate Lloyd’s claims for themselves.

First, in his chapter on historiography, Lloyd notes that historians in both early Greece and China aimed to teach and advise those in positions of political power, and he claims that to this extent, “The beginnings of historiography in both cultures are political” (p.18). He adds that the development of historiography in the case of China took an “official” route, in the sense that most histories were either commissioned by the state, or at least were written by persons in official positions with access to state archives. Both of these points can be disputed, but I will concentrate on the former. Lloyd’s claims about the “political” nature of early Chinese historiography rest primarily on a consideration of works such as the Chunqiu, Zuozhuan, Shiji, and Hanshu, which report mainly—though by no means exclusively—on political events and prominent figures connected with the ruling house. Yet, such was not the only kind of historiography being done in early China, nor was all historiography aimed at rulers. Consider, for example, the “Shi Qiang Pan,” an inscribed bronze vessel from ca. 900 BCE. This vessel tells the stories of both the early Zhou dynasties and the family history of the person who cast the vessel, Scribe Qiang. (Note that the word shi rendered here as “scribe” eventually came to mean “history” and “historian.”) Moreover, the vessel is intended for Qiang’s own family, not for the king, and the recounting of Zhou history chiefly highlights the illustriousness of Qiang’s own lineage in service to the dynasty.1 In this case, historiography is more a family and religious matter (religious, in light of the ancient Chinese worship of ancestral spirits), and is not aimed at giving political advice at all. While this vessel dates from many years before the period that is Lloyd’s main focus, it is clear that the recording of family history for a non-imperial audience did not die out. For instance, in the eastern Han dynasty (25-220 CE, also within the range of Lloyd’s purview) there is a multitude of stele inscriptions recording family histories and biographies that were not intended for imperial use.2 Since many of these inscriptions were commissioned by private individuals, they also constitute counter-evidence to Lloyd’s claim about the “official” route taken by Chinese historiography.3 Thus, while Lloyd is correct that much history was written by state-supported historians and was aimed at advising the ruler, a significant amount of Chinese historiography also does not fit this mold.

Another point where there is a significant counter-example to Lloyd’s claims is in regard to cosmology. He states, “In China, the regular relations between heaven and earth are, in a sense, the responsibility of the Emperor who acts as a mediator between them …. Order in the heavens … could not be taken for granted” (p. 63). However, the early Confucian thinker Xunzi quite explicitly rejects this view, saying, “There is a constancy to the activities of Heaven. They do not persist because of Yao [a sage king]. They do not perish because of Jie [an evil tyrant].”4 Moreover, Xunzi, like most other early Chinese thinkers, sought the patronage of rulers, and in fact he succeeded in securing it for a period of time. Indeed, he was very influential both during his own lifetime and afterwards until the Tang dynasty, but ultimately this particular view of his was not widely adopted. Even though Xunzi thus represents a minority opinion, it would not be right to dismiss him merely as an instance of “the exception proves the rule”.5 For the aim of Lloyd’s book is to show how the development of certain styles of systematic inquiry can be in part explained by reference to the social and political environment. Where there exists a significant exception to majority views and practices, that means there is something further to explain, namely why the exceptional view or practice remained an exception instead of going on to become dominant, especially since these exceptions arose in the same social and political context as the dominant ones. Until that issue is addressed, we will still not have really understood why the majority practice was the way it was, and so we will not have understood why the overall trend of development took the shape it did.

A third example of where one might disagree with Lloyd concerns his explanation of why there was less consensus of views in Greece than in China. Lloyd points to the fact that Greek intellectuals had to rely on payments from students, but the only way to get and retain students was to have a better argument than one’s rivals, which lent itself to greater diversity of opinions and more competitiveness. In support of this idea, Lloyd writes, “Moreover the [Greek] record contains many examples, from both philosophy and medicine, of defections, of pupils leaving one teacher or school for another. Criticism of your own teacher—rare, if not quite unknown in China—was common in Greece, sometimes as a prelude to the pupil setting up a rival school of his own” (p. 134). Lloyd appropriately qualifies this remark about China in a footnote, where he refers to Hanfeizi and Lisi, famous former students of Xunzi’s who came to reject his teachings, but Lloyd still regards this as a “rare” instance. Again, though, the Chinese records reveal less school loyalty and more competitiveness than Lloyd lets on.6 Aside from Han Feizi and Lisi, a striking example is Mozi, founder of the Mohist school. Mozi shows a familiarity with the classical texts and rituals that is usually a hallmark of Confucian education, and scholars have long suspected that he might have studied with the Confucians at one time. Even if he did not actually study under a Confucian master, it is clear that he rejects much of the content of his own classical education, since in attacking the Confucians he wants to do away with music and ritual. Furthermore, the Mohist school had its own problems with student loyalty, as the following passage from the Confucian thinker Mencius indicates:

Mencius said, “Those who desert the Mohist school are sure to turn to that of Yang [Zhu]; those who desert the Yang school are sure to turn to the Confucianist. When they turn to us we simply accept them. Nowadays, those who debate with the followers of Yang and Mo behave as if they were chasing strayed pigs. They are not content to return the pigs to the sty, but go on to tie their feet up.” (Mencius, 7A26)7

From this, it seems clear that students were not necessarily loyal to their teachers, and the various schools of thought in early China did compete with each other for students, and not merely for the ear of rulers. Also, according to the early texts Zhuangzi and Hanfeizi, after Confucius and Mozi died, their followers split into rival groups that argued amongst themselves over the correct interpretation of their respective master’s teachings. Thus, Lloyd’s claim that the diversity of views in ancient Greece is attributable to a greater competitiveness among Greek thinkers does not seem as well supported he presents it.

The above cases are only a few of several instances where Lloyd’s analysis may not be entirely convincing. That is not to say that his generalizations are totally wrong. Indeed, there is usually some well-founded basis for each of his claims, but nevertheless on many points a closer reading of the source materials shows that the situation is still even more complex than is reflected in his account, despite the great care he takes not to over-generalize.

Overall, Lloyd is to be commended for forming the bold ambition to compare the Chinese and Greek traditions and then pursuing it with the diligence that The Ambitions of Curiosity clearly evinces. Regardless of whatever shortcomings it may have, Lloyd’s work is in general well worth reading and thinking about, and Ambitions is perhaps especially suitable as an introduction to his approach for those unfamiliar with it, since the project began from the Isaiah Berlin lectures given by Lloyd at Oxford in 2000, and it retains some of the characteristics of a general lecture, which makes it easy to approach for non-specialists. For specialists, it is worth noting that while Ambitions does present certain new lines of argument and extend Lloyd’s comparative approach into some subjects he has not covered before, many of the lessons drawn in the last chapter of Ambitions are either strongly prefigured or even stated outright in the final chapter of his previous work, Adversaries and Authorities, which as a longer book tends to go into somewhat greater detail than Ambitions does. Therefore, specialists or others looking for more thorough treatments of the subject matter may find it more useful instead to read Adversaries and Authorities, or The Way and the Word, since the latter is also supposed to present a more complete case for Lloyd’s views.8


1. For a translation and detailed analysis of this vessel, see Shaughnessy, Edward L. Sources of Western Zhou History. University of California Press, 1991.

2. I thank Miranda Brown for information on these sources.

3. Even better examples of such “non-official” historiography are the fangzhi (“local gazetteers”), which were initially written by local gentry, not government officials. Such works appeared much later (Song dynasty) than the period Lloyd is considering, but they show that even if Chinese historiography started as largely an “official” pursuit, it certainly did not stay that way for the whole imperial period of Chinese history.

4. Cf. Xunzi, ch. 17.

5. Xunzi was not entirely alone in this view, either, since it was partially derived from earlier Daoist thinkers such as Laozi and Zhuangzi, who promoted a view of Heaven as indifferent to humankind.

6. Indeed, in certain respects the very idea of “schools” of thought in early China is a construct of later Chinese thinkers, rather than a historical fact. See Csikszentmihalyi, Mark and Nylan, Michael, “Constructing Lineages and Inventing Traditions through Exemplary Figures in Early China” (forthcoming in T’oung P’ao).

7. Translation from D.C. Lau. Mencius. Penguin, 1970.

8. I would like to thank Chris Bobonich, Miranda Brown, P.J. Ivanhoe, and T.C. Kline III for comments on an earlier draft of this essay.