The American Philosopher: Interviews on the Meaning of Life and Truth

Placeholder book cover

Phillip McReynolds, The American Philosopher: Interviews on the Meaning of Life and Truth, Lexington Books, 2015, 287pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498513159.

Reviewed by David Boersema, Pacific University


In the early 1990s Giovanna Borradori conducted a series of interviews with many of the most renowned philosophers of the day. The result was her book, The American Philosopher: Conversations with Quine, Davidson, Putnam, Nozick, Danto, Rorty, Cavell, MacIntyre, and Kuhn (University of Chicago Press, 1994). Although some of the stars in the constellation of the philosophical elite were not included (e.g., Rawls), there was an overarching focus for the selection of those who were: she wanted to get a candid, insider's statement from influential philosophers who, while firmly in the analytic tradition, saw themselves as being more or less also within the pragmatist tradition. The conversations therein covered broad metaphilosophical commitments and reflections, in the sense of charting the course of their own work over their careers as well as musing on American philosophy in general.

Now, more than twenty years later, Phillip McReynolds offers something of a reprise, albeit with a different cast of characters. In his book, also titled The American Philosopher (but with a different subtitle: Interviews on the Meaning of Life and Truth), only two of Borradori's interviewees reappear, Putnam and Rorty. The others are: John E. Smith, John Lachs, Douglas Anderson, Vincent Colapietro, Joseph Margolis, Richard Bernstein, James Campbell, Judith Green, Bruce Wilshire, Richard Shusterman, Lucius Outlaw, Larry Hickman, Erin McKenna, and Crispin Sartwell. Where Borradori's group were household names for professional philosophers of any bent -- note that all are recognizable by last names only -- McReynolds' group is more familiar for professional philosophers who self-identify as engaged in "American philosophy," a term intended to carry significance beyond being philosophers who happen to be (North) American. Indeed, much of the content of the conversations address the distinction between "American philosophy" and "philosophy in America" as will be discussed below. One final preliminary word before turning to that content: the conversations that are included in this volume are a selection from a larger series of interviews by McReynolds that included more than forty philosophers. A video documentary of can be found at: (A somewhat surprising omission of a noted American philosopher who has contributed broadly to contemporary pragmatist philosophy is Susan Haack.)

The term "American philosophy," perhaps surprisingly, has been somewhat vague. While it has tended to primarily include philosophical work done by Americans within the geographical confines of the United States, this has not been exclusively the case. For example, Alfred North Whitehead came to the United States relatively late in life. On the other hand, George Santayana spent much of his life outside of the United States. Until only recently, the term was used to refer to philosophers of European descent. Another focus for defining, or at least characterizing, American philosophy has been on the types of philosophical concerns and problems addressed. While American philosophers have worked on traditional areas of philosophy, such as metaphysics, epistemology, and axiology, this is not unique to American philosophy. Many scholars have highlighted American philosophers' focus on the interconnections of theory and practice, on experience and community, although these, too, are not unique to American philosophy. The people, movements, schools of thought and philosophical traditions that have constituted American philosophy have been varied and often at odds with each other. Different concerns and themes have waxed or waned at different times. For instance, the analysis of language was important throughout much of the twentieth century, but of very little concern before then, while the relation between philosophy and religion, of great significance early in American philosophy, paled in importance during much of the twentieth century. Despite having no unique core of defining features, American philosophy can nevertheless be seen as both reflecting and shaping collective American identity over the history of the nation.

It is this very issue -- what, if anything, is American philosophy? -- that is one of the central foci of the themes of interviews in McReynolds' book. Indeed, for him, this is a guiding assumption, as he notes, "A fundamental thesis behind this volume is that ideas, even philosophical ideas -- especially philosophical ideas -- emerge in a time and a place and can really only be understood with reference to that time and place" (xiii). A critic of this thesis is Rorty, who dismisses the notion of a unique American philosophical tradition as being useful. He remarks that one could spin a story about an Australian or Belgian (or other national) philosophical tradition, but it's not really worth doing. The bulk of the interviewees, however, concur with McReynolds, claiming that there is an "American philosophy" and it is borne out of an "American experience." Much of the volume, then, elaborates on what constitutes such a tradition.

Many philosophers in America who could be the audience for this book might hope for more elucidation on "first-order" philosophical concerns, i.e., what American philosophy contributes to standard philosophical fields of interest, such as philosophy of science, philosophy of language, philosophy of art, normative ethics, etc. While these are touched on in some of the interviews, there is (surprisingly?) less attention paid to them than one might have hoped. For instance, Putnam and Hickman speak about naturalism, Sartwell and Wilshire speak about language, and McKenna and Outlaw speak about the nature of personhood (particularly in connection with gender and race). However, the bulk of the content here is on other concerns and themes.

Some readers might also expect that a volume such as this would emphasize the history of American philosophy and an elaboration on the influence of major American philosophers on contemporary philosophical matters, for example, how Peirce is relevant to theories of scientific explanation or how Dewey is relevant to theories of moral obligation or how James is relevant to theories of knowledge. While there is a minimal amount of this that comes out in the interviews, detailing such history of influence is not McReynolds' purpose. Rather his purpose is quasi-anthropological. As he notes, he hopes to address: "What does an American philosopher look like? Where do they come from? What disposes an American to become a philosopher and, once a philosopher, what factors influence him or her to take an interest in the American philosophical tradition?" (xii). The result is a set of themes that emerge from the personal testimonies of the interviewees. (Getting at many of these themes, from a historical perspective, is Bruce S. Silver's and Nancy A. Stanlick's Philosophy in America: Interpretive Essays, Volume II (Prentice Hall, 2004). McReynolds' volume, however, gets at them from a first-person, informal vantage point.)

One of the prevailing themes throughout the interviews is the value of philosophy, both for the individual and for the community at large. Bernstein and Sartwell both speak to what they see as the transformative force of philosophical engagement and outcome, that is, the worth of engaging in philosophical work and the betterment that can and does result from that engagement, again both for the individual and for the greater community. A second theme, one directly related to the broad value of philosophy and philosophizing, is that of progress and optimism. In particular, Anderson and Wilshire speak of American philosophy as wrestling with the notion that philosophy, along with other human endeavors, can make progress and that the American intellectual landscape is optimistic in that sense. Attention to such a concern -- can philosophy make a positive difference? -- is, for McReynolds, the sort of theme that should be identified with American philosophy, as opposed to, say, analytic philosophy and its concern with, say, whether proper names are rigid designators or not.

Other related themes that emerge are the importance for American philosophy of the notion of geography and place. As McReynolds puts it, "Ideas don't emerge from nowhere, disembodied, floating in the ether. Ideas are produced by real, embodied individuals who have problems, needs, interests, and biographies" (xiii). The American experience, as opposed to that of Europe, intimately involved a frontier and wilderness, not only as a geographical fact, but also as an experiential background. American culture and American philosophy was, in a word, differently situated than that of Europe. This difference, and a discussion of its relevance, is emphasized in many of the interviews, particularly those of Green and Colapietro.

Given McReynolds' starting point of embodied inquiry (there is no view from nowhere), a theme that runs through nearly all of the interviews is that of philosophical professionalism, that is, what it means and implies that philosophy is a discipline carried out by professionals (i.e., those with academic credentials and pedigree). Lachs and Smith, for instance, both bemoan aspects of such professionalism in the sense that it has to a large degree isolated and insulated American philosophers from what could and should be their role in broad social and political discourse. (How many Americans know John Dewey and how many American know Donald Trump?) Because, for McReynolds, American philosophy is purposefully concerned with the interplay of theory and practice -- as is especially emphasized in the interviews with Margolis and Shusterman -- this disengagement is noteworthy. This is not to say that the rigor of professionalism is negative; for McReynolds and the others, that is not the case. Rather, the attitude and practice of philosophers as belonging only, or primarily, within academe is.

Given, too, the importance that McReynolds attaches to the "American" aspect of American philosophy (and who/what is an American philosopher), it might be somewhat disappointing to some readers that the interviewees are almost exclusively white males (with Judith Green, Erin McKenna, and Lucius Outlaw being the exceptions). There is a body of literature available that includes other voices, for example, American Philosophies: An Anthology (Blackwell, 2002), edited by Leonard Harris, Scott L. Pratt, and Anne S. Waters, American Indian Thought: Philosophical Essays (Wiley-Blackwell, 2003), edited by Waters, and Susanna Nuccetelli's Latin American Thought: Philosophical Problems and Arguments (Westview Press, 2002). That said, McKenna and Outlaw, in particular, explicitly address the issue of pluralism, along the dimensions of gender, race, identity, etc.

Does McReynolds accomplish what he set out to do? If his goal was to give readers an insider's view of a number of self-identified American philosophers today, then yes. Much like Borradori's volume of two decades ago, the interviews are candid and revealing, with respect to the individuals themselves and to the kinds of philosophical concerns they address and the perspectives they propound. However, for those who do not necessarily share the assumption, or implications, of the claim of the uniqueness of American philosophy, there are questions. Of course, ideas don't emerge from nowhere, but nonetheless there are commonalities and even human universal concerns. Why aren't philosophy of mind questions, such as the nature of mentality, ones that are relevant to American philosophers and non-American philosophers alike? Why aren't questions about the nature of human responsibilities to non-human animals ones that are relevant to American philosophers and non-American philosophers alike? Why aren't questions about aspects of gender bias in the understanding of political rights ones that are relevant to American philosophers and non-American philosophers alike? Is it really the case that truth (or goodness or beauty) is different for American philosophers and for non-American philosophers? If so, why would non-American philosophers care about American philosophy? If not, then what exactly is the importance and value of demarcating American philosophy from non-American philosophy? McReynolds is certainly correct to note the embodied nature of philosophical inquiry, but to what (important) degree and manner is that embodiment to be identified with nationality? Situatedness is real; it matters. But, again, there are human universals, including philosophical questions, that also matter. Perhaps a more profitable approach to understanding and assessing the meaning and significance of American philosophy is not to ask how it is unique or separate from other philosophical traditions but instead to ask in what ways it can benefit and also benefit from these other traditions.

To the extent, then, that McReynolds is attempting to provide a descriptive account of what American philosophy is (as opposed to work done by philosophers in America), this volume indeed gives careful and useful insight. On the other hand, to the extent that McReynolds is attempting to provide a prescriptive account of why and in what ways American philosophy (again, as opposed to work done by philosophers in America) is uniquely important and instructive, it is not as obvious. Nevertheless, with that all said, engaging with this volume of interviews is most certainly a fruitful experience and is enlightening for what it attempts to do and what it does not attempt to do.