The American Pragmatists

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Cheryl Misak, The American Pragmatists, Oxford University Press, 2013, 304pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199231201.

Reviewed by David A. Hollinger, University of California, Berkeley


It is an admirable and eminently defensible philosophy: "A naturalized account of truth and knowledge, in which we deal with anomalies or the surprise of experience" by engaging them in the context of "a shared body of beliefs" which we "revise in light of recalcitrant experience, coming to beliefs that better stand up to the pressures of experience and argument." This is Cheryl Misak's summary of the pragmatism of which her new book is offered as a history. So understood, pragmatism is indeed a wise philosophy. Misak shows us how it comes to us through a long series of debates stretching back to Charles Peirce and Chauncey Wright in the 1860s, proceeding through the works of William James and John Dewey, and then the writings of C. I. Lewis, W. V. O. Quine, Wilfred Sellars, and several more recent philosophers.

Not all constructions of the pragmatist tradition are as epistemologically focused as this one, or as dominated by the sense that Peirce was basically correct all along and that James, Dewey, and others succeeded or failed depending almost entirely on the extent to which they kept close to Peirce's ideas. This singleness of mind has a payoff in the genuine light she casts on the relatively recent history of this tradition. Her accounts of Lewis, Quine, Sellars, Morton White, Nelson Goodman, Hilary Putnam, and Donald Davidson are by far the most engaging sections of the book. Her long meditation on the adamant anti-Peircian Richard Rorty repeats long-standard complaints, and is thus of less interest. But few others have traced as rigorously and convincingly as Misak has the ways in which the others just named are pragmatists in her sense. Misak is particularly insistent on Quine's debts to a pragmatic tradition he was slow to acknowledge, and she is excellent in reminding readers how similar to Quine's views were those of White and Sellars on crucial issues. Her account of Lewis, which is almost as lengthy as her chapter on James, is perhaps the finest section of the book. Misak gives us a pragmatist tradition that thrives in the 1940s and 1950s, and works well with the varieties of analytic philosophy we associate with that era.

It is a surprise that she never mentions Thomas Kuhn, despite Kuhn's massive and acknowledged debt to Quine, his pervasive influence on Rorty, and his increasingly widespread recognition in our own time as one of the most influential American philosophers of the 20th century. The 50th anniversary of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions last year featured symposia and other commemorative events at Princeton, MIT, Chicago, and several academic sites in Europe, plus several special features in professional journals and at the annual meetings of a number of learned societies. Given the way Misak defines pragmatism, Kuhn would be easily assimmilable to it.

Equally surprising, she alludes only briefly to Robert Brandom, yet several of the essays recently published as Perspectives on Pragmatism: Critical, Recent, and Contemporary have been around for a while, and would fit neatly into Misak's project. Philip Kitcher is an avowed pragmatist and extremely productive in that style of philosophy, yet he does not rate even a footnote or a spot in her bibliography. The essays Kitcher recently reprinted in Preludes to Pragmatism: Towards Reconstruction of Philosophy, have, again, been widely discussed. Richard Bernstein figures primarily as a commentator on others. Hence Misak's chapter on "The Current Debates" is anticlimactic and puzzlingly elliptical.

Misak is at pains to refute the claim Louis Menand offered as a virtual afterthought in his popular book of 2000, The Metaphysical Club, that pragmatism was pushed aside because of Cold War ideologies more conducive to logical empiricism. But this half-baked thought is an easy target and Misak seems not to realize that Menand's work as a whole is highly derivative of earlier scholarship (especially that of Bruce Kuklick, Philip Wiener, and Edmund Wilson), and largely resuscitates a 1950s cultural-nationalist view of pragmatism long since disavowed by specialists. The key book for Misak should have been James T. Kloppenberg's Uncertain Victory of 1986, which established commandingly that the most salient ideas of the classical pragmatists in the United States were very closely akin to contemporary intellectual movements in England, France, and Germany. Yet Misak makes no mention of this book, which contains extensive accounts of James and Dewey in the wider context of North Atlantic, rather than simply American, intellectual history. Misak herself retreads the old "American Studies," cultural nationalist view of pragmatism, opening the book by calling pragmatism "America's home-grown philosophy" and trying to claim Cadwallader Colden as a precursor of pragmatism. It is apparently Menand who persuades Misak that Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr., should be treated as a pragmatist, yet she ignores the substantial literature on this question by Thomas Grey and others.

Misak's treatment of the classic pragmatists is slightly idiosyncratic. In her discussion of James, which one might expect to be the core of a historical study of the American pragmatists, she quotes only a few passages from Pragmatism but expatiates at some length on the much less pertinent The Will to Believe, and misses entirely the considerable transformation in outlook between the collection of essays published in 1897 and the book of 1907 that defined the movement. Although she recognizes that James was concerned with "the religious hypothesis," she ignores the saturation of James's entire body of work with this preoccupation, and omits entirely Pragmatism's own persistent focus on "salvation" and on the search for God. In a remarkable footnote, Misak informs us that James's wife "did have strong beliefs in a Christian God," leaving altogether out of focus James's own agonized vacillations on this issue and his frequent statements to religiously affirming friends that he was a better Methodist than some of them were.

To be sure, this religious matrix of James's ideas about truth and knowledge is not directly relevant to the later history of the pragmatist tradition, but Misak's James is one instructed by later, secular philosophers on what is important, and what is not. The point of a deeper understanding of what James was trying to do is more than an antiquarian's indulgence. Rather, it liberates from our own parochialism the actual content of James's mind, which we can then take or leave as we may wish. Anyone at all familiar with James's life-long obsession with the preservation of a Protestant sensibility in an age of science will not find it worth citing another scholar, as she does, for having observed that James's complaints about Absolute Idealism "often had a moral focus." This is like citing someone for discovering that "Marx was often concerned with the character of capitalism," or that "some of Comte's formulations reflected an ambition to make society more scientific." Much of what James wrote becomes less enigmatic, and James's failure to write what we wish he would have written more understandable, if we remember who he was and whom he was trying to persuade, and of what. Misak tells us very little about that, and deals with him as if he were a contemporary of ours, trying to answer our questions but doing so in odd ways.

Happily, Misak's rather obtuse treatment of James is followed by a lucid ten-page account of Josiah Royce in which Misak gets exactly right the heavily pragmatic element in Royce's later thought. She gets wrong by five years the date of Royce's crowning work, The Problem of Christianity, making it a posthumous work of 1918, but she accurately traces to Peirce a theme in this work's virtual socialization of the Absolute, rendering it an essentially horizontal, community-centered, worldly presence rather the vertical, more persistently transcendental one it had been previous to this book. It is surprising that so devoted a Peircian as Misak pays no attention to the 1923 volume, Chance, Love, and Logic, the first collection of Peirce's writings. This book was edited by one of Royce's most prominent students, the logic-preoccupied Morris R. Cohen, whom, astonishingly, Misak, having first listed along with Lewis and Arthur O. Lovejoy among Royce's students, then twice describes mistakenly as a student of John Dewey. Chance, Love, and Logic was an important episode in the development of Peirce's reputation, obviously inspired by Royce.

That Misak understands Royce so well while having so little to say about other contemporaries who took an interest in pragmatism appears to follow from her resolutely Peircian priorities. In a brief chapter on "The Reception of Early American Pragmatism" she confines herself to what British and American philosophers said about James, ignoring the vigorous (but decidedly non-Peirceian) Italian reception to which Francesca Bordogna and others have called sustained attention. Misak makes no reference even to Giovanni Papini, with whom James corresponded and whom he cites appreciatively in Pragmatism, and who is a point of entry to the crypto-fascist conversation about James that is part of the history of pragmatism's reception even if not the part that leads to Kitcher and Brandom. If pragmatism is to be protected from its religious matrix, so, too, it would seem, must it be protected from its sometimes dubious political applications.

But these frustrations need not stand in the way of our appreciation of what Misak has accomplished. A more serious desideratum is just who among American philosophers of the last sixty or seventy years are clearly not pragmatists by Misak's definition, and just what disputes mark off this tradition from its rivals. An interesting test case might be my late colleague, Bernard Williams, especially in regard to his persistently historicist Truth and Truthfulness. Williams's disagreement with Rorty in that book and elsewhere is plain enough, but is Williams so much at odds with the more Peircian construction of pragmatism that Misak develops and defends? Perhaps, but this is an example of a question worth pursuing that Misak leaves unasked. In her effort to save pragmatism from Rorty, how far has she opened its doors in the other direction? How wide a swath of modern philosophy in the United States is to be understood to be at odds with pragmatism, and just where does pragmatism locate its philosophical enemies?