The Ancient Quarrel between Philosophy and Poetry

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Raymond Barfield, The Ancient Quarrel between Philosophy and Poetry, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 278pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107000322.

Reviewed by Richard Eldridge, Swarthmore College


Barfield undertakes to survey, compare, and assess i) various conceptions of what he regards as poetry's founding influence on philosophy, centered in poetry's expressions of wonder and of experiences of the divine, and ii) philosophy's various self-definitions against that influence, via resistance, counterargumentation, and appropriation. The project is carried out in 12 chapters, each on one or two major figures from the history of philosophy: Socrates-Plato, Aristotle, Plotinus-Augustine, Boethius, Dionysius, Thomas, Vico, Kant, Hegel, Kierkegaard, Dilthey, Nietzsche-Heidegger, and Bakhtin. In each chapter, the focus is on how the various philosophers discussed specifically comment on, resist, accept but refigure, or argue about poetry's putative insights.

One way to get a feel for the project is to note what it is not. It is not philology. The individual chapters make little use of the massive secondary literatures on the philosophers discussed, and they are not intended to advance our understanding of details of individual arguments and positions by unpacking ambiguities, comparing and reconciling difficult passages, tracing detailed lineages of arguments, motifs, and images, and so forth. It is not philosophy of literature. There is no mention of or engagement with the works of philosophers such as Stanley Cavell, Martha Nussbaum, Cora Diamond, Peter Lamarque and Stein Haugom Olsen, Frank Farrell, or myself, no Derrida or Gadamer or Adorno or Benjamin from the European tradition, and no Abrams, Bloom, de Man, Hartman, or Hillis Miller among critics. In various ways these philosophers and critics, and others, have thought about literature in relation to epistemology and moral philosophy, focusing on how literary works might be forms of knowing or might contribute to moral understanding. It is not philosophical reading of literature. Only one paragraph from one literary work, Steinbeck's Sea of Cortes, is discussed specifically, very briefly.

The unvoiced primary reason why Barfield does not engage with these traditions of philological scholarship and philosophy of/and literature is that he does not share their initiating assumption that the existence of God or the divine cannot just be taken for granted, but must at the very least be argued about. While some of the figures mentioned above are not strict secularists, they nonetheless all take pains to engage with secular audiences by beginning from general questions about the nature and importance of literature as a potential form of knowledge, without taking for granted that literary production is motivated by the divine or that it registers something about a divine object.

Barfield's stance is different. His governing assumption is that we are, all of us, as long as we are not too busy or cowardly or dull or distracted, always already engaged in "the human search for the truth about the world, about ourselves, and about the divine" (2); "human consciousness . . . lives most fully among the poetical limits of life -- portents, history, stories, the gods" (2). Poets are then, at least initially, the ones most in touch with and able to give expression to this human search and to the situation of consciousness. Poets, or at least poets as Heidegger receives them, "utter the holy in the middle of darkness, sensing and singing clues about that which eludes a benighted age" (251), and Barfield largely works within this Heideggerian framework, though without at all privileging Heidegger's vocabulary. Poetry is primal, formal, finished, and seductive in being in touch with the initiating conditions of human existence, including the divine; philosophy in contrast is belated, open, skeptical, unfinished, and difficult (25).

At more or less the beginning of philosophy, "the poets speak. Socrates questions" (10), thus initiating a quarrel between poetic openness to the divine and philosophical suspicion. Within this quarrel, "the exercise of both poetic and philosophical gifts constitutes a feeling after and a reaching for patterns, connections, meaning" (41), with poetry mostly playing the role of inspired but potentially untrustworthy initiator, given over to mania, and philosophy mostly playing the role of interested but skeptical critic, concerned with clarity and individual self-possession. "If philosophy reminds the mousikos that the beauty here is not to be taken as the end of the story, the poets remind of the beginning, which, even if it is a ladder to elsewhere, is a start, and the journey must begin somewhere" (59).

In tracing what he sees as the essential affiliations and resistances that bind and distinguish literature and philosophy, Barfield is consistently enchanted with the divine, perhaps even drunk with it. In an important summary passage, he writes, in his own voice,

the poet is always after the mystery that god who is unknown can be revealed only as the one who is unknown. . . . Humanity measures itself against the godhead and thereby becomes more fully human, and thus capable of knowing itself as philosophy spurs it on. This is the crux: philosophy returns again and again to poetry because philosophy needs the gods (253).

In an age in which many, living within the orbits of modern science and of cosmopolitan diversity, no longer have available to them many possibilities of either immediate, wholehearted immersion in widely shared rituals or immediately trustworthy resonances with a divine-in-nature-and-in-human-life, such claims are likely to seem to many to be somewhat hasty, unargued, and overblown. Does humanity measure itself against the godhead? Does philosophy, in its most trustworthy precincts, in fact return again and again to poetry because it needs the gods? Should it? Perhaps the answer to each of these questions is "yes," and Barfield has done some useful work in articulating and assessing various ways of saying "yes." But many are likely to want more than this -- -more epistemology, more philosophy of literature, more moral philosophy, and more readings of literary texts -- if they are to embrace this stance.

In criticizing Dilthey's more secularist effort to develop a poetology without reference to the divine, thus overcoming metaphysics in favor of sociohistorical human studies, Barfield offers the following small argumentative allegory. "If an amnesiac find himself in the desert feeling great thirst, the fact that there is no water and that he cannot recollect what water is does not diminish the connection between his thirst and the existence of something that satisfies his thirst" (214). Just so, and contra Dilthey, is it with us, according to Barfield: we have a thirst for god or the divine that genuinely has god or the divine as its genuinely existing object, even if we have lost, forgotten, or repressed this fact. But is this right? Do we have this thirst? Does it really have that genuinely existing object?

Perhaps one should not demand proofs of the existence of God in order to answer this question. And perhaps, failing them, one should also not take it for granted, with Feuerbach, that talk of God is a mere displacement of natural human desires that are best satisfied otherwise than in religious life. But if one is to accept the significance of this argumentative allegory, one will want, I think, more than Barfield gives us: more epistemology, more moral philosophy, more detailed readings of the significances of literary works, more philosophy of literature: in general more detailed and multi-faceted critical philosophy of culture.