The Angel of History: Rosenzweig, Benjamin, Scholem

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Stéphane Mosès, The Angel of History: Rosenzweig, Benjamin, Scholem, Barbara Harshav (tr.), Stanford UP, 2009, 208pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804741170.

Reviewed by Eric Jacobson, Roehampton University



Stéphane Mosès’s The Angel of History is a classic in modern Jewish philosophy and a fine choice for the Stanford series Cultural Memory in the Present edited by Mieke Bal and Hent de Vries. The new translation by Barbara Harshav has made a meaningful contribution to this chain of tradition, carefully rendering complicated phrases from French that once served as interpretations in thought and deed from German. Since the first publication of this pioneering study in 1992, it is surprising to note how much has changed in the scholarship on Franz Rosenzweig, Walter Benjamin and Gershom Scholem. For one, it is no longer common to place Benjamin under the lens of Marxism. Equally, Rosenzweig is more commonly viewed in the light of Levinas, Expressionism and Heidegger today than in the shadow of Martin Buber. But perhaps even more, our picture of Scholem has considerably changed with the ongoing scholarship of the Kabbalah. We have generally come to see all three figures in their intellectual context more deeply rooted in modern German history and our understanding of the tensions evident in their work — between thought and action, rupture and causality, and indeed a Jew in a Christian world — has expanded considerably since the first publication of this book. The first English translation cannot help but raise questions regarding the study of modern German-Jewish thought two decades on.

The book is divided into three equal parts with each figure receiving three chapters, yet Rosenzweig emerges as the dominant figure. This is perhaps inevitable from a scholar whose earlier work entitled System and Revelation is a close reading of Rosenzweig’s magnum opus, The Star of Redemption. Still there are formal grounds for Rosenzweig’s preeminence. An exchange of letters from 1921 establishes the influence of The Star of Redemption on Benjamin and Scholem. There is evidence to suggest that Benjamin shapes his early Messianism in relation to The Star. Scholem’s debt to Rosenzweig is evident in many places, not least in a 1930 lecture delivered in Rosenzweig’s memory. With Rosenzweig as the benchmark, Mosès seeks to uncover the affinities between the three figures in the notions of history, time and language. He is the first to recognize the conceptual mutuality of the three authors and the need to understand them as part of a common tradition. However, in emphasizing their commonality, thematic structures meant to suggest fraternity occasionally ring hollow and the contrasts insufficient. For example, the association of the three with the categories of “religion”, “revolution” and “Zionism”, as Mosès suggests in the opening chapter, yields very little ground. Whereas the religion as leitmotif for Rosenzweig is self-evident, there is a very narrow road to revolution in Benjamin and little practical Zionism in Scholem. Much stronger is the notion of a common approach to history, which Mosès understands as a revolt against the idea of progress, a history leading to greater forms of reason that finds an epiphany in Hegel. As he remarks: “Past suffering is not abolished even by a triumphant future, which claims to give them meaning, and more than thwarted hopes are refuted by the failures that seem to sanction them” (11).

Rosenzweig’s turn to religion and away from a promising career in philosophy in the footsteps of Hegel, has much to do with his notion of time. Mosès delicately reconstructs the origins of Rosenzweig’s ideas on temporality through his letters with Eugen Rosenstock, an exchange that Mosès justifiably terms one of the most moving dialogues in Jewish-Christian relations. The debate concerning “chosenness” and “stubbornness”, two ideas integral to the notion of election, is perhaps the most revealing. Stubbornness, meaning the refusal to accept the belief in Jesus as Messiah, is entirely a category of Christian theology, says Rosenzweig, not an attribute of Jewishness. While Rosenstock sees election in Judaism as a relic of antiquity and as evidence of Judaism’s refusal to accept history and progress, Rosenzweig interprets “stubbornness” as part of the doctrine of election transferred to the Messiah that is an essential component of the concept of redemption in Christianity. The belief in a new election imbues Christianity with a fallacious sense of supremacy, he claims, and is also the source of a difficult asymmetry, for the role that Judaism plays in the doctrine of salvation and mission in Christianity has no counterpart in Judaism. Moreover, it is arguable whether the concept of election is a central article of Jewish faith, says Rosenzweig. We may add that in the rabbinic literature, no uniform doctrine of election can be easily discerned. Rather than theological, election takes on political and historical significance in Rosenzweig’s view. Modern European nationalism has sought to extend the doctrine of mission to worldly affairs with the aims of establishing “the complete Christianizing of the concept of people” under the ruse of secularism (29). Modernity comes to represent “the total secularization of Christianity or the total Christianization of Western civilization” (33). Election has an equally universalizing and unifying purpose in Judaism but no corresponding mission in history, he claims. It bears meaning only outside of history. It is here that Rosenzweig begins to formulate a two-fold conception of Judaism between its worldly existence and its inner transcendence, which was later to reappear in a central position in The Star of Redemption. Set outside the politics of temporality, Jewish history represents a counterpoint to the secularized Messianism of modern nationalism, a meta-history which relies on an alternate view of the unfolding of events in a parallel current of sacred time.

Mosès attributes Rosenzweig’s concept of secularization to his critique of Hegel. Yet he would appear at times closer to Hegel than Mosès suggests. On one hand, Rosenzweig thoroughly repudiates the notion of history as the unfolding of reason. On the other hand, he maintains that secularization, or the Christianization of modernity, lays the groundwork for the unfolding of redemption. In a departure with most Jewish theology, Rosenzweig introduces an intimate relationship between the two religions, in which the advent of Christianity becomes a theological necessity for The Star of Redemption. In his view, Judaism renounces temporal history and substitutes a meta-history of sacred time in its place, but it is still part of a wider experience in the life and death of nations. Judaism cannot be entirely beyond history here, as its own redemption is tied to the unfolding of Christianity, secularism, and modernity. Even if the Jewish people do not serve universal history, they still remain within the framework of temporal history. Mosès argues that by naming Hegel’s universalism a recent avatar of Christian history, Rosenzweig subverts the teleology of the system and places the notion of election in the league of modern nationalisms. However, in Rosenzweig’s view of Jewish history as experienced through the ritual symbolism of the cyclical year, it is difficult not to see a commonality with Hegel in the space between the categories and lived experience.

Here one may lodge notable differences between Rosenzweig and Benjamin. Mosès rightly illustrates how both authors shared an imminent concept of redemption and the ways in which Benjamin’s Messianism, as with other subjects, remain consistent throughout his lifetime. Mosès speaks of a model in Benjamin’s thought which is anti-sequential, exemplified by the conclusions to the Origins of German Tragic Drama that “a work of art can never be deduced from those that precede it”. There is no history that follows unwaveringly from one advancing moment to the next, and no experience that is reducible to mere sequence, generalization, even totalization. Rather than a progression, history lies below layers of stratification (85). Redemption at any moment meant for Benjamin the search for a historical site between the incessant return of the unremarkable and an infinitely new that anticipates a complete and final end. Redemption was on no absolute course, symbolized by the last line of his On the Concept of History, which understands the immediacy of redemption as the door through which the Messiah may enter at any time. In addition to his own conceptual continuity in which, as “nothing is ever abandoned, everything is preserved”, Benjamin was equally concerned with continuity and causality in history (101). In the early years, he was indeed attracted to the systematic nature of The Star of Redemption, yet he would ultimately follow a course that was intrinsically methodical. He sought to avoid any theurgical impulse, favoring notions such as the “unintentional” of human acts which advances redemption without active causation. The delicate tightrope act that he performed between the free will of the individual and the necessity of redemption is characteristic of his approach. In the early years, this was presented in the guise of the Greek tragic hero who reverses his own fate by choosing the time and place of his own decline. In the later years, the tightrope is spanned across the interpretation of history, where each generation participates in a “weak messianic force” through the act of interpretation. It is not a Marxist end of history, based on qualitative and cumulative factors, and not a system in the sense of The Star of Redemption, but it remained a consistent focus of Benjamin’s political theology and vision of redemption.

Of the three figures, Scholem lived the longest, which would presumably offer greater opportunity to understand him. But I suspect Mosès’s general proximity to Scholem left less room for reflection. In the third section of The Angel of History, Scholem appears surely as one of the lesser angels in the shadow of the other two. He is not the remarkable figure that we have come to know through his journals and letters, which were published after The Angel of History, nor the quintessential scholar of Jewish thought who single-handedly transformed the study of Jews and Judaism today. Here The Angel of History has aged less well. Scholem’s inspiration is undeniable and the ideas that he developed together with Benjamin beginning in 1915 had a lasting impact on his work. The partnership reached its height in 1923 with Scholem’s departure for Jerusalem; Rosenzweig was already stricken with illness by then. Scholem’s political, theological and historical ideas continued to develop for fifty years. Mosès presents these years under a cloud of disappointments, extending Scholem’s discontent even to his scholarship of Jewish history. However, the more we understand of Scholem, the less we are inclined to see him as a nihilist who has retreated to a world of symbolic forms. Mosès claims that the young Scholem was initially drawn to Marxism, which is somewhat ironic since Scholem himself professed the same of Hannah Arendt, equally spuriously. In Scholem’s case, his journals and letters point unambiguously to a form of religious anarchism that was not too dissimilar from the German-Jewish circle that emigrated to Palestine in the early 1920s. At times Mosès seems to conflate Scholem’s scholarship with his religious anarchism. An example is his discussion of Messianism. Scholem’s Messianic idea is “always born of a historical frustration, it appears, in the collective consciousness, as compensation for a loss, as a utopian promise designed to make up for current misfortune” (131). It is a paradox, says Mosès, that the very existence of Messianism is predicated on its realization and yet its realization is its own abrogation. This phenomenon is then relayed to Zionism, since Zionism, he claims, “is the heir of Jewish Messianism” in Scholem’s view (133). He continues:

living in Jerusalem for more than ten years, he soon saw his ideal of a ‘spiritual’ Zionism devoted to the internal regeneration of the Jewish people collapse in the contact with the political reality of the country. In Scholem, this disillusion assumes the proportions of an authentic metaphysical crisis. His increasingly pronounced interest in heretical mystic doctrines combines with his political disenchantment to lead him close to a radical nihilism. (154)

These conclusions seem wrong for several reasons. Today we understand Scholem’s self-proclaimed nihilism to have begun quite early in discussions with Benjamin and to have had little to do with his research into the history of Jewish thought or his criticisms of Israel. If his nihilism was a response to Zionism, then surely it was a Zionism of 1917, when Scholem penned an open letter to the German Jewish youth movement entitled Abschied (Farewell). As an overarching motif in Scholem’s thought, Mosès reads nihilism in a few too many places, leading him to conflate Scholem’s research in the early years in Jerusalem with his later publications on Sabbatianism (the mystical Messiah of 1666, Shabatai Zvi), which some critics have read as a veiled critique of Zionism. The idea of Zionism in the work of all three messengers of history, however, may require a fresh approach. Rosenzweig and Benjamin were never Zionists, says Mosès, and while it is true that Benjamin rejected “practical Zionism”, as he once wrote to Scholem, he did consider himself part of a cultural movement which can be understood as cultural Zionism. In retrospect, we may come to see all three figures as being much more closely linked to an intellectual rejuvenation of Judaism than the political organization of a nation state. This realization also suggests a historical turn in Modern Jewish Thought which views these figures as resting uneasily with the Jewish self-determination movements of the twentieth century. Still The Angel of History is one of the few studies in twentieth century Jewish thought and philosophy to draw out a common tradition and render the comparative notions of temporality and causation accessible. This comparison is achieved by coalescing all three thinkers around a bifurcated notion of history: one that makes its appearance in worldly affairs, guided by the hand of the conquerors, and another based on an indelible thread that links this generation to a history to come. All three partook of this view to varying degrees and its final resolution in a Messianic redemption.