The Animal Question: Why Non-Human Animals Deserve Human Rights

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Cavalieri, Paola, The Animal Question: Why Non-Human Animals Deserve Human Rights, tr. Catherine Woolard, Oxford University Press, 2001, 192pp, $22.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195143809.

Reviewed by Chris Belshaw, The Open University


This short, elegant and well-focused book does exactly what it says on the jacket, both front and back, and puts the case for attributing basic human rights to animals. Unlike many who take this side, Cavalieri’s argument, set firmly and openly within the analytic tradition, is austere and rigorous throughout, and has none of the hyperbole, the tugging at heart-strings, the harsh detailing that characterizes much that is written in defense of animals.

Framed by an opening chapter which links the animals debate to the shifting parameters of a broader philosophical and cultural framework and a close that puts firmly the case for the extension of human rights, the book’s core consists of a substantial and carefully articulated argument about moral status. Cavalieri’s major claims here are first that moral status attaches to sentience—and is neither wider than this, contra the claims of many environmentalists, nor, against what is here described as humanism, narrower—and second, that there are no good grounds for believing that such status admits of degrees, such that, on a more moderate humanism, members of our species have, or typically have, more of it than animals.

Some of this, as Cavalieri acknowledges, is familiar. Only a few will need to be reminded of the argument that animals, insofar as they are sentient, are deserving of moral consideration, and only a few will hold out against this, either by denying the antecedent, and insisting that animals do not feel, or by rejecting the conditional, appealing here to the obscure Kantian claim that, because they cannot judge, we have only indirect duties to animals, or to the related contractarian account, where moral status attaches only to those who might be thought to have bargained with us.

Similarly, many readers will already have been persuaded that attempts to maintain a sharp divide between the human and non-human realms all fail—distinctions here are blurred first by the strong suggestions of reason, language and self-consciousness among some animals at least, and, perhaps more importantly, by the absence of such characteristics among certain members of our species. There is some unclarity here in the argument for the autonomy of moral concern—though Cavalieri follows the arguments against speciesism in insisting that biological differences cannot straightforwardly sustain moral distinctions, such differences evidently bear on psychology, and from here morality is a stone’s throw. Yet setting these difficulties aside, the argument from marginal cases insists that as the psychological characteristics we deem relevant to moral status will not unerringly track species distinctions, so human beings cannot all occupy, and occupy alone, the prime position.

Where do we go from here? Certain well-known positions come in for sharp criticism. While Singer’s utilitarianism is noticeably generous in granting moral status, and at first appears fair-minded in insisting on equal consideration of interests, its aggregativism still allows that animals might be disposed of whenever, and as often, their interests are outweighed by ours. And though Regan wants to give to certain animals a degree of protection very much akin to our own, his subject-of-a-life account, with its insistence on higher forms of consciousness, means that he is markedly more curmudgeonly in granting the requisite status in the first place. For Cavalieri such wavering is unsustainable, and the case for animal rights can, indeed must, be much further advanced. And so where the argument is especially meritorious is in its unflinching pursuit of the implications of what has thus far been claimed. Cavalieri wants to insist that as we are wrong, where the basics of morality are concerned, to mete out different treatment to differently abled human beings, so, similarly, moral distinctions between ourselves and (most) other animals are not in the end sustainable.

The penultimate chapter contains much of the detail here, focusing in particular on the basic interests that animals can justifiably be said to have. And Cavalieri, in arguments that are sometimes convoluted, insists that they, like us, have concerns for welfare, for freedom and, more controversially, for life itself. Nor, in spite of the best endeavors of Mill or, latterly, Singer himself, can we uncover grounds for ranking their concerns somewhat below ours. For equality claims, she maintains, fasten not so much to consideration as to the interests themselves. And so an animal’s interest in staying alive cannot in any systematic way be ranked lower than our own.

Thus the job of the last chapter is to drive this home. As we grant full human rights to all human beings, regardless of their physical or intellectual capacities, so we should, on pain of inconsistency, do the same for animals. Animals, like us, should have their interests in welfare, in freedom, and in continuing to live, protected against the systematic and institutionalized mistreatment, which is so often, and too often, their lot. And this concern with rights, Cavalieri maintains, is only appropriately demanding. The focus here on the right, in contrast to the good, allows us to sidestep many of the counterintuitive implications of consequentialist and utilitarian accounts. Nevertheless, significant change is demanded, with animal husbandry, scientific experimentation and various forms of systematic extermination all in need of prohibition. Anything less, she insists ‘subverts not merely what is right, but the very idea of justice’.

There are, I think, certain weaknesses in the argument, and I’ll mention one or two. But first I want to air a couple of reservations about Cavalieri’s overall strategy. She displays, often, familiarity and confidence with both historical and contemporary material pertinent to the animal question. As she rightly notes, the history here is considerably more complex and circuitous than any thumbnail sketch would have it. And so rather than attempt such a sketch, she wisely sets out to focus on key figures within this history, and similarly, on certain central moves. All of this, along with the frequent deft articulation of various philosophical positions is impressive. But there is room for doubt as to how far certain of these brisk summaries will convince, and the occasional suspicion that opponents’ positions, in particular, are unfairly characterized. I mention one such case below. A related point: in a couple of cases, first with Kant in Chapter 3, second the treatments of DeGrazia in Chapter 5, the discussion takes on a momentum of its own, and threatens to unbalance the whole. Precisely because the overall argument is so well aimed, these sections feel very much like asides which, even if intrinsically not uninteresting, leave at least this reader impatient to get back on target. And one might feel that the space here, along with some of that where the summaries are more concise, might have been better given to the argument itself, and used to identify and then buttress its weaker or more controversial claims.

What, then, are those claims? First, though I’ve little doubt that Cavalieri is right to insist on sentience, it isn’t obviously a mistake to doubt this. Even if the line between humans and animals isn’t as clear cut as many would have it, we can still ask how there can be consciousness without self-consciousness, and then whether there are grounds to attribute self-consciousness to those animals – by far the majority – which don’t seem, by the customary signs, to exhibit it. And this brings me to the uncharitable reading I mentioned above. Though Descartes’ writings may well be peppered with references to the immortal soul, it is plainly not right to accuse him of a thoroughly arbitrary appeal to metaphysics in his likening animals to automata. Although the emphasis on language might need to be modified, his point, surely, is that close observation of the outer show suggests there’s nothing mental going on within. Cavalieri’s argument here is way too snappy.

That’s a first point. But others are linked. Even if we give animals the benefit of the doubt here, and assume consciousness, sentience, and thus a secure foothold within the moral community, still it can seem that there are differences, and morally significant differences, between those creatures which are self-consciousness and those which aren’t. This has a particular bearing on the comments about an animal’s right to life. There are problems however you do it, but the best account of the badness of death, where human beings are concerned, centers on its depriving us of the sort of life to which we are already committed—depriving us of the ability to fulfill plans and projects already laid down. So for those creatures unable to be in this way future orientated, the badness of death is problematic. Certainly death reduces, in many cases, the number of good experiences that would otherwise obtain, but as it is difficult to see why it would be better if more animals were born, so it is equally difficult to see why, where they are effectively little more than series of discrete moments, it would be good if their lives were longer. And so given the connection between rights and interests, it remains unclear why the right to life should have more than a toehold within the animal domain. And lest there be any doubt that more is aimed at, it is Cavalieri’s view that rights should be granted to mammals, birds and ‘probably vertebrates in general’ (139).

A final criticism: though there is much laudable about the abstract theoretical approach, it does have its weaknesses. And one might be to underplay the localized, genetic, and compromising nature of rights theory. Equal rights, when granted, derive, arguably, not so much from the firm positing of equal interests as from the difficulty in drawing and defending distinctions when granted. Perhaps there are reasons for wishing things were otherwise, but even where something as seemingly straightforward as freedom is concerned, it needs to be noted that most human beings have their freedom of movement constrained by national frontiers. Similarly, rights to drive, to vote, are bestowed neither universally, nor on a case by case basis, but on the basis of blanket rulings. (These are not yet human, nor are they negative rights, but those differences don’t fatally undermine the point of the analogy). And so even where our species alone is concerned, it is unclear to me that the system of rights has the degree of elegance, in practice or in theory, that Cavalieri claims for it.

Turn to animals, and the complexity is magnified. We are still few enough, and cohesive enough, to allow a system of rights to function more or less effectively. But animals are many, and mostly alien both to us and to each other. And if they are to have rights then, presumably, not only are we prohibited from intentionally but also from foreseeably harming them, prohibited not only from using them as means, but also from riding roughshod over them. Because birds and small mammals at least are inevitably killed, injured or displaced, it will be difficult to build roads, or to drive upon them, difficult to clear land for arable farming, to dredge harbors, to fly. Now it may be that these difficulties are ones we ought to face, but there is little point in pretending that the endeavor will be other than paralyzing.

Nor should we think that such problems will be generated only by our putting people first. Rights for animals will in certain ways work against non-human interests as well. We will be prohibited first from any attempt to look at competition between species, and to bring about a balance of nature, second from culling or confining individuals for the benefit either of the species as a whole or (though these are typically linked) for other individuals, and third from many of our efforts to help an individual directly. Better, perhaps to let an animal die, than to infringe its right not to be confined. I don’t say that Cavalieri overlooks completely the attempt to think some of this through—particularly on the last point, concerning paternalistic interventions, there are some hard to fathom remarks—but there is much more to be done here. And what this more will involve, certainly, is a deeper and more extended consideration of environmental philosophy’s contribution to the animal rights debate than is achieved by Cavalieri’s mere handful of comments I alluded to above.

These problems with the argument are serious. Nevertheless, Cavalieri’s book remains welcome, representing as it does a sharply delineated and always engaging contribution to an often muddled field. Though animal ethics is no longer wholly marginal to mainstream analytic philosophy, The Animal Question will help secure for the subject a firmer and more central position. But I began with the jacket, and will end there. Executed in Rastafarian colors, with center stage given to an unflattering wide-angle photo of a donkey, it does animals no favors, and says little for the design unit of the American branch of OUP.