The Anthropocene Project: Virtue in the Age of Climate Change

Placeholder book cover

Byron Williston, The Anthropocene Project: Virtue in the Age of Climate Change, Oxford University Press, 2015, 209pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746713.

Reviewed by Dale Jamieson, New York University


Most people seem puzzled by the term 'Anthropocene', but those who are not puzzled seem to have very strong opinions about it. For some, the term is a euphemism for a catastrophe that is already underway. For others, it names a new age that offers the prospect of unlimited human improvement. For these unpuzzled people the Anthropocene is yet another site for the ancient debate between those who believe in some version of original sin and those who see humanity as the agent of its own redemption.[1]

Others bring a more modern political frame to the Anthropocene. They want to abolish the term in favor of 'Capitalocene', 'Plantationocene' or various other amusing (and not so amusing) terms. Their point is that we are not all in this together. The present crisis is yet another instance of the ruling class preying upon the people (and plants and animals) of the world. Here the term 'Anthropocene' becomes a magnet for the latest incarnations of Academic Marxism, now suitably inflected by all relevant prefixes (e.g., 'post', 'trans', 'neo').

Most philosophers are probably among those who have never heard the term 'Anthropocene'. If brought to their attention (perhaps by the previous paragraph), they are likely to think that this is just another instance of those darned humanists creating neologisms to mask the obscurity (or perhaps platitudinous) nature of their thought (something philosophers never do of course). This reaction would be mistaken. The Anthropocene is an important concept, and the book under review is the first serious, full-length discussion of the topic by a philosopher (that I know of anyway). So listen up.

Byron Williston's book "is an extended reflection on the ethical meaning of . . . [climate change] to our civilization." (p.1) He emphasizes two features of this threat. First, "we cannot manage to act meaningfully to counter, avert, or even mitigate a disaster that we can see coming from a mile away." (p. 6) Second, "we are the principal causal source of the disrupted climate." (p. 6-7) We "must look to our disordered passions and beliefs to explain fully our failure . . . If we are going to find a morally defensible path through the climate crisis we need to become better people, and that means cultivating the virtues." (p. 7) The heart of the book is an explication and defense of three virtues the author thinks are central to preparing us to confront the threat of climate change: justice, truthfulness, and hope.

Williston exemplifies these virtues as well as discusses them. His book is generous, well-written, and carefully argued. For philosophers who haven't noticed rising sea levels and collapsing glaciers, it is a good introduction to why these matter both to their personal and professional lives. By relating his discussion to "mainstream" ethics, action theory and moral philosophy, Williston provides an excellent bridge for philosophers, from the familiar literature of their discipline to the facts about climate change. For environmentalists and others with little experience in philosophy, the book bears powerful witness to the relevance of our discipline. Nothing that I say in what follows detracts from these very considerable achievements. The questions and arguments that I pose are further expressions of praise and respect.

Despite the frequent use of the term 'Anthropocene', Williston is fairly casual about telling us what it is, or why it is important that we think in these terms. He writes that "The Anthropocene is the age of inevitable human intervention in Earth's macrosystems." As it stands, this is not very helpful. What is 'inevitable' supposed to signal here'? Couldn't it be said that humans have always affected fundamental Earth systems, though of course now more than ever? And is 'intervention' the right word (as opposed to say 'affected')? A traveler from Alpha Centauri might "intervene" in Earth systems, but is this the proper way to talk about the actions of creatures who have been produced by these systems, act on them, and continue to be acted upon by them? The fact is that Williston is more interested in climate change than the Anthropocene and he gives us little feel for what other problems the Anthropocene may present. Moreover, he is not so much concerned with either climate change or the Anthropocene as with what he calls "the Anthropocene Project."

The Anthropocene Project is the task of extending the Enlightenment Project, which was characterized by its strong commitment to moral progress. In the pursuit of moral progress "The key figures of the Enlightenment" (p. 49) were motivated by justice, truth, and hope. The task of the Anthropocene Project is to "learn or relearn, how to be genuinely just, truthful, and hopeful people." (p.50) In Williston'a telling, these virtues are entwined and it is not easy to get a clear account of each individually.

Justice is a virtue with a strong historical lineage. However, from Plato to Rawls it has meant different things to different people and it is not entirely clear what it means to Williston, though it surely involves a commitment to an expansive version of Cosmopolitanism and great respect for the interests of future generations. He devotes considerable space to a rewarding discussion of the moral psychology of justice, exploring its relations to greed, shame, honor, moral weakness, and the "lure of efficiency."

Hopefulness is a Christian virtue, not countenanced by the classical Greek philosophers. Williston is concerned to distinguish hope from such states as wishful thinking. Hopefulness motivates us to act on climate change, thus to "preserve across the generations . . . the sense of justice." (p. 151) "Presentist" thinking, "the belief that the suite of normative commitments and institutional arrangements that make up the present . . . fully define future possibilities," (p. 151) undermines hope.

While both Christians and classical Greek philosophers value truth, neither includes truthfulness in the catalogue of the virtues. (There are interesting reasons why not, but that is a story for another occasion.) Williston's concern for truthfulness is inspired by the thinkers of the Enlightenment who associated the pursuit of truth with science. Science gives us power over circumstance and enables us to improve our lives. Climate change denial is an important part of what disables us from responding to the threat of climate change, and so it is no surprise that most of the chapter devoted to truthfulness is a (sophisticated) discussion of climate change denial.

The questions I want to raise are not so much about the details of the discussion as the broader frame. Much more can usefully be said about the Anthropocene itself before embarking on the Anthropocene Project, and though I will not argue the point here I think that a broader perspective might lead us to a focus on different putative virtues.[2]

Two different discussions of the Anthropocene are now underway. One discussion concerns whether the International Commission on Stratigraphy (ICS) will decide that the planet has entered a new epoch, the Anthropocene. This is a technical, geological question, centering on whether distinctive strata can be found in the Earth's crust that would support such a designation, and how such a designation would hang together with the current periodization of the Earth's history. The other discussion is about whether the Anthropocene provides a useful concept for thinking about our current cultural, moral, and political moment. In my opinion, even if the ICS declines to declare the Anthropocene a geological epoch, it will still be an important concept for understanding the defining circumstances of our present condition.

The most obvious feature of the Anthropocene is the growing human population and its demand for energy, food, goods, services and information, along with the need to dispose of its waste products. At the beginning of the Holocene there were probably about six million people living as hunter-gatherers; today, there are more than seven billion people, expected to grow to nine billion within the next 30 years, and to eleven billion by 2100. Many of these people command resources that not even the nobility would have enjoyed a few centuries ago; and all of them have legitimate aspirations to decent standards of living.

Improved healthcare and increased food availability have allowed many people to live better and longer, while globalized markets and technology enable constant access to all kinds of goods and services. However, none of this is free, and many cannot afford the price. The Earth is home to almost one billion people living in extreme deprivation at or below $2 a day. Many more are malnourished, die young of easily curable diseases, have no access to important information flows or are socially and politically marginalized. While it is true that never have so many had so much as in the Anthropocene, it is also true that never have so many had so little.

Technology enables the production levels that have allowed humanity to grow in size to today's unprecedented numbers. It empowers people to move around in search of a better life, inspiration or simply a good time. It also enables "action at a distance" that would once have seemed inconceivable, whether as the instantaneous transfer of wealth, power or resources; as a remote exchange of corporate or diplomatic information; or as a sexual encounter in virtual reality with someone on the other side of the world.

The conjunction and effects of large population, high consumption and powerful technologies have unprecedented implications. In some respects we feel empowered: we can save a child in a faraway land by making a phone call and pledging a contribution; someone in Las Vegas controlling an unmanned drone can stalk and kill terrorists on another continent; the swipe of a credit card can deliver all sorts of amenities to remote parts of the world; a few clicks at a computer allow us to instantly register our opinions about pretty much everything and share them globally.

In the Anthropocene small acts can reverberate far beyond their spatial and temporal locations in surprising and unwanted ways. By flipping a light switch I may tap into some distant source of energy and activate, reinforce and promote the emission of greenhouse gases that will remain in the atmosphere for centuries. The accumulation of such apparently trivial, localized, individually innocuous acts can alter fundamental planetary systems in ways that have global consequences, which in turn are locally actualized. Together we change climate, drive species to extinction and acidify the oceans -- thus harming and burdening humans and ecosystems in faraway places and times, and ultimately bringing trouble to the very places where we live, to ourselves, and to the families that we love. What makes the Anthropocene a moment of crisis is the recognition of humanity's collective power that is oddly and perhaps paradoxically matched with a widespread feeling of individual powerlessness.[3]

Framing the challenges of the Anthropocene in this way would involve writing a different book than the one under review. The challenges of the Anthropocene are capacious and will not be exhausted by a single work. I recommend this book strongly to all those who want to see how some traditional philosophical notions can be extended in our struggle to cope with climate change.

[1] These debates are insightfully discussed by John Passmore in Man's Responsibility for Nature (Duckworth, 1974), and Carolyn Merchant, The Death of Nature (HarperOne, 1990).

[2] See my "When Utilitarians Should be Virtue Theorists," Utilitas 19, 2 (2007): 160-183, and Chapter 6 of Reason in a Dark Time.

[3] This is a point I have made repeatedly over the years. See for example "Ethics, Public Policy, and Global Warming," Science, Technology, and Human Values 17, 2 (1992): 139‑153. The formulation draws on Dale Jamieson and Marcello Di Paola, "Political Theory in the Anthropocene," forthcoming in D. Held and P. Maffetone (eds.), Global Political Theory (Polity Press).