The Apologetics of Evil: The Case of Iago

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Richard Raatzsch, The Apologetics of Evil: The Case of Iago, Ladislaus Lob (tr.), Princeton UP, 2009, 115pp., $26.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691137339.

Reviewed by Colin McGinn, University of Miami



Perhaps Iago is the only person not puzzled by Iago, and there are signs in the play that he isn’t entirely clear about Iago either. We know his actions perfectly well, and he works as a dramatic figure, but we don’t understand why he does what he does — we don’t grasp his motivation. We observe his plot to destroy Othello by instilling jealousy (and incidentally Cassio and Desdemona) but we don’t discover what motivates him to undertake such a plot — with its evil, its risk, and its extremity. Worse, we seem to apprehend that he has no motivation; he is a motivational blank tablet, ontologically not merely epistemologically. In The Apologetics of Evil Richard Raatzsch edges probingly around this void, trying his best to make sense of it: his book is astute, determined, sensitive — but not an unmitigated success. The puzzle of Iago persists.

Raatzsch is on the right track when he notes the phonetic affinity of “Iago” and “ego”: Iago is certainly egotistical, egoistic, and egocentric. He recognizes no standard beyond himself; indeed, he hardly seems to grasp the reality of other people at all, save as tools, marks and dupes — always means, never ends. Raatzsch sees the character Iago as an incarnation of what he calls the “the concept of Iago”, the idea he embodies: he is best understood as a paradigm or exemplar. But it is still unclear what concept he embodies. He seems like a pathological version of something, but of what exactly? Iago is memorable and exciting, and universally hated by audiences of Othello; we have strong feelings about him. He also seems locked in a kind of dark conceptual symbiosis with Othello — as if he is the other half of a hybrid organism. Othello is warm, ingenuous, honorable, trusting, yet fatally credulous and weak; Iago is none of those things, but cold, deceptive, manipulative, and impervious to anything but his own perverse will. We feel we understand Othello — only too well, in fact — while Iago challenges our normal ways of explaining human action. It all seems so gratuitous.

As Raatzsch observes, Iago himself offers three interpretations of his motives while engaging in conversation with others. Each of these is familiar enough and offers the prospect of normal understanding. The first is the resentment and wounded pride he feels in being passed over for promotion in favor of Cassio. But this explanation is more to persuade the susceptible Roderigo of why he might want to destroy Othello and fails to explain why he is willing to go to such inordinate and bizarre lengths. Also: why not just hire someone, say Roderigo himself, to kill Othello? The second alleged reason is jealousy for his suspected cuckolding by Othello. But this is pure conjecture at best and leads to no comparable anger towards his wife, Emilia — as well as being obviously false. Third, he cites his own cupidity in extracting money from Roderigo. But this too is implausible, as he shows little interest in money and could surely think of other ways to make it than by risking his life and reputation. Such motives actuate other people, but in the case of Iago they seem wide of the mark. Raatzsch also discusses Iago’s possible resentment at being subservient to another person, and his principled policy of using his master for his own ends; but again this seems flimsy and post hoc — not the steel spring that pushes Iago on. What we must accept, Raatzsch suggests, is that Iago is not really a human being equipped with human motives — he is a monster, a teratological phenomenon. And we cannot understand monsters in human terms; or rather, we cannot assume that Iago’s psychology is that of an actual or possible human. He may be a version of a human, a hyperbolic representative, but his pathology is so extreme that he fits into no ordinary human category. Maybe he is an aspect of human character taken to an extreme and detached from everything else that is human.

Raatzsch builds up to his answer to the question of what the concept of Iago is by suggesting that Othello is a “panopticon”. He writes:

Just as a field guide to plants could manage with a series of pictures alone, without any text, gradually allowing the reader to form the concepts of ‘primrose,’ ‘fern,’ daffodil,’ and so on, so Othello, through its successive scenes, defines what one might call ‘the concept of Iago.’ But given that this is a concept of something pathological, the totality of the scenes can be viewed as presenting a systematically organized visible display of curious, deviant, and otherwise noteworthy phenomena; a display of this kind will be called a ‘panopticon.’ (33-4)

The panopticon that is Othello, then, presents several pictures of Iago that compositely reveal his mode of being. I wasn’t clear exactly how this notion of a panopticon differs from the orthodox idea of describing a character by seeing how he behaves in a variety of situations, and it is odd to compare a linguistic object such a written play to a series of pictures, but I think it is quite true that Shakespeare avoids psychologizing about Iago and simply presents him to us from the outside. The final scene, in which Iago is challenged by Othello to explain himself, elicits only the famously laconic lines: “Demand me nothing. What you know, you know. From this time forth I never will speak word.” Shakespeare has presented us with the facts about Iago and there is nothing crucial that has been omitted; we know him in so far as he can be known. And what have we observed of Iago? We have observed his daring, his ingenuity, his powers of deception and manipulation, his abhorrence of traditional ideas of virtue, his verbal skill, and his ruthlessness. We have seen him hatch and execute a bold and risky plot, whose point remains elusive. Here is where Raatzsch thinks the truth lies: Iago is above all a schemer. His passion is to control others and determine the course of events by operating secretively to bend reality to his will. Mostly people scheme to achieve a certain end, say wealth or political success or seduction, but Iago schemes so as to be scheming. For him scheming is an end in itself; it has intrinsic value, not merely instrumental value. It is, for him, a kind of sport, in that he does it for its own sake — for the sake of playing the game, engaging in the activity. It stimulates his mind, tests his wits and resolve, and calls for strength, determination and fearlessness. He didn’t deceive Othello in order to destroy him; he destroyed Othello in order to deceive him — deceptive scheming was the end not the means. It wasn’t, then, that Iago particularly hated Othello, or Cassio for that matter; the hate was just a front to excuse undertaking the scheme. Iago’s psychology is like that of an addictive gambler: he doesn’t gamble in order to make money or to cause misery in those he bests; he gambles in order that there be gambling in his life — he values the activity, not its effects. What centrally thrills Iago is the abuse of other people’s trust, the sense of power this gives him; causing people to die, as such, is not his primary object. Merely having Othello done away with would not have satisfied his craving to scheme against others. In fact, on this interpretation, Iago almost loves Othello, precisely because he has given his tormentor the opportunity to exercise his greatest talent and achieve his highest joy. Othello is in effect Iago’s unwitting partner in a competitive game — he is what makes the game possible, and Iago loves nothing more than the game and winning in it.

I like this ludic perspective on Iago: for, certainly, he is taken up by the scheme he puts into effect and derives a perverse joy in seeing his scheming work its magic. But I have two problems with it as a complete interpretation of Iago’s psychology. First, it accords too little weight to the evil side of Iago’s mind and will: for not just any scheme will do — it has to lead to the misery and death of a virtuous person. It is not merely incidental to Iago’s plan that wholly innocent people will perish in utmost despair; this is part of its essence. If Iago were asked by his military superiors to scheme against the evil enemy for a good cause, one feels that he would willingly do it, but that his evil heart would not be fully in the project. It is not the scheming by itself that he so prizes when he plots Othello’s downfall; he would certainly not be interested in doing a bit of worthwhile scheming with Othello, say against the dreaded Turks. What he relishes is the evil scheme, the scheme without justice or sense — the pure perverse destructiveness of it. The second (connected) point is that Raatzsch never mentions a telling line of Iago’s towards the end of the play, about Cassio, but it might just as well be applied to Othello: “He hath a daily beauty in his life/That makes me ugly”. So he does feel resentment towards Cassio, and no doubt Othello — though it may not coincide with the reasons for resentment he cites to others. He feels a kind of stinging inferiority — that of the “ugly” for the “beautiful”. He clearly doesn’t mean physical ugliness and beauty here; he means the spiritual kind, the aesthetics of the soul. Moral virtue and things of the soul simply don’t move him, and he senses this lack in himself; there is much bravado, I think, in his earlier affirmations of self-satisfaction at his own stark egoism. What he is doing in carrying out his plot is, accordingly, destroying those that remind him of his nagging lack, and he does this by relying on his strengths — his craftiness, coolness, and hardness. They may have in abundance what he lacks, but he can get the better of them by dint of what he possesses in full measure. If this is right, then envy also lies at the root of his actions: he schemes so as to assuage his envy. There are two salient sides to Iago: his inherent maleficence and his power of scheming. Raatzsch, I think, accentuates the latter at the expense of the former. In so doing he fails to explain why Iago undertakes so terrible a plot. He thus fails to face up to Iago’s famous "motiveless malignity" (my italics in Coleridge’s much-cited phrase).

In the shorter second half of his book, Raatzsch offers, surprisingly, to “defend” Iago. He distinguishes between justifying Iago’s actions and defending the man who performs them; he accepts that nothing can justify the actions, but he thinks that nevertheless the man can be defended. I found this part of the book unclear and unconvincing. Raatzsch is not about to find extenuating motives for Iago’s actions, as that it was really quite beastly of Othello to prefer Cassio to him for promotion, because Iago has no such motives to start with. But it never becomes clear what the proposed defense amounts to, except to assert that Iago’s actions result by natural law from his given character (he couldn’t have done otherwise). That might at best absolve Iago from blame, since he is not a free agent, but it doesn’t in any way provide a defense of having that type of character. Raatzsch also notes that we can admire some of the traits and skills that go into Iago’s wicked scheming — his cool head, his cleverness. But that again affords no defense of his character, unless a torturer can be “defended” for his skill and coolness in torturing. In the end I really don’t know what Raatzsch’s project of defense is intended to be, and I can’t see how he achieves it. It is true enough that Iago is not simply a villain, a human type with whom we are familiar; he is far too extreme for that, and far too perplexing. He is an inhuman monster (“Oh inhuman dog!” Roderigo exclaims); he is not the kind of typical villain one finds in Dickens, say. He is rather, as Othello says, a “demi-devil”, a supernatural agency somehow deposited on earth. But it is no defense of a devil to note that he is no regular villain.

Despite this weak section, the book is generally well-written, resourceful, often perceptive, and always interesting. If the author fails finally to remove the puzzle from Iago, that is something he shares with every other commentator. Perhaps our next question ought to be to what extent the other characters in Othello are really intelligible in terms of motives that explain their actions. Desdemona seems unnaturally virtuous, patient and forgiving (and is her love for Othello ever really made intelligible?). Roderigo seems far more easily duped than any intelligent person could possibly be. Othello is bafflingly susceptible to Iago’s deceptions for one so mature and battle-hardened. Cassio seems both naïve and worldly. And why did virtuous Emilia ever marry Iago to begin with? Could it be that Shakespeare intentionally offered us a clearly unintelligible Iago while slyly creating other characters whose motivations don’t really add up either? Did he think that human behavior never makes sense in terms of rational perspicuous motivations? Is it his view that in the end it is a mystery why people do what they do? Is the whole idea of motivated conduct a kind of fiction?