The Apology Ritual: A Philosophical Theory of Punishment

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Christopher Bennett, The Apology Ritual: A Philosophical Theory of Punishment, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 210pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521880725.

Reviewed by Gabriel S. Mendlow, Yale, Law School and Department of Philosophy


Christopher Bennett's The Apology Ritual defends a retributive theory of state punishment modeled on the moral phenomena of blame and apology. The book is in three parts. In Part I, Bennett examines rival theories of the justification of punishment and identifies several "retributive themes" that he will later develop and interweave. The main argument of the book begins in Part II, where Bennett pursues what he calls a "'right to be punished' strategy," arguing that "we owe it to wrongdoers to blame them and to expect them to apologize" (8). In Part III, Bennett uses his account of blame and apology to ground a conception of state punishment -- "the apology ritual" -- that combines elements of retributivism and restorative justice. Bennett envisions a criminal justice system that would suspend some of an offender's rights as well as require her "to do the sort of thing that she would be motivated to do spontaneously were she appropriately sorry for her offence" (152).

The Right To Be Punished

Bennett's argument for the view that wrongdoers have a right to be punished proceeds in part from the assumption "that the central cases of wrongdoing involve qualified members of some intrinsically valuable relationship whose actions demonstrate a fundamental failure to respect the demands of that relationship" (125). Two of Bennett's preferred examples of "intrinsically valuable" relationships are the relationship between neighbors and the relationship between professional colleagues. Bennett claims that when a person commits a wrong within the context of such a relationship, the other members of the relationship "have a duty to respect the wrongdoer's status as a member of that relationship (to give them the appropriate recognition)" (125). Bennett argues that the other members of the relationship can respect the wrongdoer's status only by blaming her and expecting her to apologize. Moreover, the blame in question must be retributive, the sort of blame whose proper expression is the imposition of "hard treatment." Non-retributive blame -- mere moral criticism -- does not respect the wrongdoer's status as a qualified member of an intrinsically valuable relationship. Mere moral criticism is a response appropriate to bad acts that result from non-culpable ignorance, the sort of wrongdoing committed by those whose status is not that of a fully qualified member of an intrinsically valuable relationship.

Bennett's argument for the view that wrongdoers have a right to be punished contains a number of interesting observations about blame and apology as well as an illuminating exposition of P. F. Strawson's treatment of moral responsibility. Yet the argument leaves at least two important questions unanswered. The first concerns Bennett's general account of the basis of the rights and duties that the members of an intrinsically valuable relationship supposedly possess. Bennett does not tell us what it is about an intrinsically valuable relationship that makes its value intrinsic; nor does he tell us how the supposed intrinsic value of such a relationship gives its members rights and duties rather than reasons of a less stringent sort. Contrary to Bennett's apparent assumption, it is far from obvious that the relationship between neighbors or between professional colleagues has value in itself, value apart from the (extrinsic) value that such a relationship has for civil society or for scientific progress or for the wellbeing of the relationship's members. (Friendship, love, and family are perhaps the best candidates for having value in themselves; yet these relationships receive less or none of Bennett's attention.) Even if Bennett were correct in assuming that the relationship between colleagues (for example) has intrinsic value, he would still have to explain how the intrinsic value of collegiality bestows upon colleagues any rights or duties, let alone the punitive rights and duties whose existence Bennett wants to demonstrate. No doubt things of intrinsic value ordinarily give us reasons -- typically, reasons to honor and protect the things in question. Yet these reasons, however weighty they may sometimes be, are not automatically (or even usually) duties. Duties are reasons of a special moral significance and a particular logical form.

The second question left unanswered by Bennett's argument for the view that wrongdoers have a right to be punished concerns the scope of blame. Because Bennett apparently takes blame to consist in the withdrawal of respect within a valuable relationship (106-109), Bennett's view seems unable to explain how we could ever be entitled to blame people outside such a relationship. On the contrary, Bennett's account of blame seems, for example, to imply that I can properly blame someone for being a bad friend only if she has been a bad friend to me. Bennett indeed seems bound to deny not just the propriety but even the coherence of blaming someone with whom we do not enjoy a valuable relationship: where there is no relationship-based respect in the first place, there is none for us to withdraw. To put the criticism in Strawson's terms, Bennett's account of blame allows for the personal reactive attitude of resentment but seemingly not for the impersonal reactive attitude of moral indignation.

Bennett could counter this criticism by claiming that we are all fellow members of the moral community, itself an intrinsically valuable relationship; so when you betray your friend, you offend against an intrinsically valuable relationship of which I am a member; therefore, when you betray your friend, you offend against me. The problem with this response is that, though it enables me to blame you for the acts or omissions by means of which you betray your friend, it does so at the cost of making me a second victim of your betrayal. I still cannot blame you for the wrong done to your friend; I can blame you only for the wrong done to me, a fellow member of the moral community. This reduces impersonal moral indignation to an anemic form of personal resentment.

The Apology Ritual

In Part III, Bennett applies his conception of blame and apology to the political community conceived as an intrinsically valuable relationship among equal citizens. Bennett claims "that citizens have responsibilities to one another that follow from the nature of [the] common enterprise" of being members of a political community (153). When a citizen fails to discharge these responsibilities, she merits collective blame, which (per the argument of Part II) consists in the political community's withdrawal of certain forms of relationship-based respect, in particular, the suspension of some of an offender's rights (presumably including the right not to be confined) and the "imposition of amends" (154).

Bennett calls his theory of punishment "the apology ritual" because "it recommends making the offender act as she would were she genuinely sorry for her offence" (146). Punishment involving secular penance is in Bennett's view "more symbolically adequate" (146) an expression of collective condemnation than is mere hard treatment because secular penance or atonement ("at-one-ment," as Bennett points out) implicitly acknowledges that the wrongdoer's status will in most cases eventually be restored to that of a full citizen.

Bennett examines at some length the "laissez-faire conception of restorative justice" (126) according to which wrongdoing should meet with "conscientious spontaneous individual action" (127) instead of state punishment. Though in the end he rejects the laissez-faire conception, Bennett expounds it with much sensitivity and seems deeply impressed by its advantages. (A virtue of the book is that it contains no straw men. Bennett always presents objections and alternative views as forcefully as possible.) Bennett ultimately rejects the laissez-faire conception because he concludes that the value of collective condemnation outweighs the advantages of informal restorative justice.

A controversial yet unstated premise of Bennett's argument in Part III is that liberty -- in particular, liberty from confinement and enforced secular penance -- is not a pre-political right. If liberty were a pre-political right, it would not be among the rights bestowed on citizens by membership in a political community. But if liberty were not among the rights bestowed on citizens by membership in a political community, the withdrawal of respect constitutive of a political community's collective blame could not involve the deprivation of liberty; for blame (in Bennett's view) is the withdrawal of respect within a valuable relationship, in other words, the withdrawal of the respect to which the blamed party is entitled only by virtue of her membership in the relationship. But if collective blame could not involve the deprivation of liberty, then it could not involve enforced secular penance or incarceration. Since Bennett thinks that state punishment should indeed involve enforced secular penance and presumably also incarceration, his argument must assume that liberty is a political right, a right that people possess only by virtue of their membership in a political community. This assumption is implausible, as it entails that arbitrarily incarcerating noncitizens would not violate their rights. The assumption is also incompatible with political liberalism, which takes liberty to be the quintessential pre-political right. Though this incompatibility is not in itself a defect, it undermines Bennett's claim in Chapter 7 that his argument for the apology ritual is consistent with a form of political liberalism.

Because liberty is most likely a pre-political right, Bennett's argument probably does not succeed in justifying incarceration or enforced secular penance. But if Bennett's argument is otherwise sound, it might nevertheless justify the deprivation of rights whose origin is genuinely political, such as the right to vote or the right to run for public office. The Apology Ritual is therefore to be commended for chipping away at an old and obstinate philosophical problem -- the justification of punishment -- even if we must look elsewhere for a justification of incarceration.[1]

[1] Thanks to John Jost for helpful comments.