The Architecture of Reason: The Structure and Substance of Rationality

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Audi, Robert, The Architecture of Reason: The Structure and Substance of Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2001, xvi + 286pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-195-14112-1.

Reviewed by Ish Haji, University of Minnesota, Morris


In The Architecture of Reason, Robert Audi develops an innovative, comprehensive account of the structure and nature of the rationality of belief, desires, action, and persons. The first principal division of the book addresses theoretical reason, the second practical reason, and the third the rationality of agents.

Exploring the nature and sources of rational belief in Part I, Audi proceeds on the assumption that the rationality of beliefs is largely parallel to their justification. Justification for any kind of element—whether belief, desire, or action—is robust well-groundedness of that element and a justification is an adequate ground. With belief, the foundational theory of justification advanced proposes that the base elements—non-inferential beliefs—have their basis in experience broadly construed, the four standard sources of justification being perception, introspection, memory, and reason (in the sense of mental activity or conscious awareness). Contrary to Cartesian foundationalism, even justification grounded in a standard source is defeasible, all such justification being prima facie. Indeed, Audi proposes that defeat may “befall even justification on balance” (20), and that “evidential grounds retain epistemic weight even when overbalanced by counter-evidence and even when undermining evidence shows that they do not carry enough weight in the circumstances to sustain (overall) justification” (21).

Audi eschews the view that coherence is a basic source of justification but grants that incoherence is a defeater of justification. He explains that the well-groundedness conception of justification accounts for why coherence typically accompanies justified beliefs: both ultimately stem from the standard sources, that, he claims, “tend to produce beliefs that are at once mutually consistent and interconnected by virtue of being explainable by their common genesis in those sources” (26-7).

Progressing to the “superstructure,” inferentially justified beliefs must themselves be based on beliefs that are justified. Both deductive and inductive inferences can transmit justification from foundations to superstructure or within either category. A representative kind of deductive transmission principle, for example, says that if one justifiably believes a proposition, q, q entails p, this entailment is within the scope of one’s understanding, and one believes p on the basis of q, then one has some degree of justification for believing p (43-4). An analogous principle of inductive transmission substitutes inductive support for entailment. Inferentially justified beliefs, just like non-inferentially justified foundations, are defeasible (45-6).

Audi favors an internalist as opposed to an externalist account of epistemic (and conative or affective) justification: the grounds (and defeaters) of justification are internal in the sense that they are accessible to consciousness, i.e., to reflection or introspection broadly interpreted. For example, even when a belief is false (and thus externally defective), we may have excellent grounds for it, such as clear perceptions we have no reason to think unreliable, that confer justification on it.

A major burden of Part II is to show that practical reason is highly analogous to theoretical reason in having both foundational elements grounded in experience, superstructure elements, and cognitive links between the two. A theory of practical reason must clarify rational action. Just as rational beliefs are grounded in elements that are not beliefs, such as seeing or understanding, so rational actions are grounded in elements not themselves actions: desire in the encompassing sense that includes intention and any kind of wanting. And just as we have direct (non-inferential) beliefs as bases of other beliefs, we have intrinsic desires as bases of other desires. At any given time, then, one’s actions are ultimately grounded in a non-inferential way on one’s intrinsic (or foundational) desires. As illustrations of such desires, Audi proposes that we want, for its own sake, to avoid certain pains, experience certain pleasures, or pursue goals whose achievement is the realization of some human capacity (72). That there are desires of this sort is highly consonant with what we think of as normally wanted, intrinsically, by rational persons, rests on considerations of how we assess the rationality of persons—it is difficult even to conceive of persons who, though they have desires, have no intrinsic desires to avoid pain or pursue their own happiness (72), and acquires support from the many structural analogies between intrinsic wants and non-inferential beliefs (74).

When we want something for its own sake, we want it for certain qualities that are frequently intrinsic to it. But wanting it intrinsically does not entail wanting those qualities. For example, one may intrinsically want to continue to swim, in virtue of qualities of one’s experience, such as the refreshing feel of the water and the sense of movement within it, but wanting to swim for these qualities does not entail a further want to have or realize them. We can, thus, conceive of intrinsic wanting as wanting on certain grounds. One’s having these grounds—wanting something for certain qualities—can play a prima facie justifying role even when one’s having them implies a false presupposition or a mistaken belief about the object of the desire, that it has these qualities, for example. In this sort of case, the intrinsic desire would be objectively (but not subjectively) ill-grounded. If desires can be ill-grounded, they can be well-grounded, and when well-grounded, they may qualify as rational just as well-grounded non-inferential beliefs can be rational. Another important parallel between rational belief and rational desire is that, just as directly but defeasibly justified beliefs can be defeated and thereafter irrationally held, so a rational intrinsic desire can be defeated and then be irrationally possessed.

Typically, non-foundational desires, for instance, a desire for something to satisfy some basic desire, are based on foundational (intrinsic) desires and may be justified by them, though they may also be based on and justified by beliefs, such as the belief that the thing wanted is good. Audi insists that belief, or something similarly informational, is needed to provide behavioral direction for desires (113), and that if an action is rational in light of a reason (desire) for it, then the agent has some rational connecting belief that doing the deed will contribute to satisfying the desire (117, 129). Here, as with inferential belief, defeasibility is possible. As with epistemic rationality, transmission relations and principles explain how a rational intrinsic desire can confer rationality on an action performed to satisfy it (130).

In his fascinating Chapter 6 on altruistic desire, Audi addresses how experience, as it is internal, can render rational our intrinsically wanting for others the same sorts of things that we want for ourselves. The key to unraveling this riddle lies in distinguishing between wanting things for their enjoyable qualities or wanting them for oneself or for self-centered aspects of them. He proposes that encountering desirable qualities of experience in our own life does not require taking what is good about them to depend on their being ours (92-3, 101-2, 105, 155-6, 229). The general form of the argument for rational altruistic intrinsic desires is simply that if it is for the qualities of an experience that I intrinsically want it, and I know (as I should if I am rational) that others are just like me in that they want similar experiences for similar qualities, then it is rational for me to want others to enjoy the same kind of experience as I do for the same qualities, and not for my sake but for their sakes. Audi concedes that one may well have to care about others to have such wants, but he claims “to care about others is, in good part, to want, intrinsically, things that one takes to benefit them” (137). Rationally cognizant of the similarity of the experience of others, if I fail to have some degree of intrinsic desire that they have the experience, then I am criticizable from the point of view of rationality in that, though not irrational in lacking the desire, having the desire is a demand of reason (144). It is a demand, in part, because in fully rational persons there must be integration between cognition and motivation.

If there are goods and evils realizable in the experience of anyone, as we ought to know if we are rational, and we do know this, then we should recognize that there are reasons for acting in certain ways toward anyone at all. Such reasons may be overridden by self-interested considerations, but they are, nevertheless, bona fide reasons. And reasons of this sort—to be altruistic in certain ways—support our commitment to basic kinds of moral principles, including (Kantian) principles of justice and moderate (utilitarian) principles of beneficence.

Audi’s affirmation of our having rational intrinsic desires confirms his rejection of instrumentalism as an account of rationality in action (123-7), and his view that there is no need to posit the self in the content of the experiences that ground rationality—for example, a self-concept need not enter into the desire that one’s pain stop (93, 105)—evidences his rejection of egocentrism as a basis of rationality in general. Practical reason, Audi claims, is not reducible to theoretical reason because practical rationality is not just a matter of having rational beliefs or cogitations. Nor is theoretical reason reducible to practical reason.

If rationality is ultimately grounded in experience, and experiences can vary across cultures, then even fully rational persons can be expected to have different beliefs or desires that are rationally grounded—relativity to grounds and content is to be expected. Part III of the book begins by examining the variability (or relativity) of rationality and its constancies.

The last chapter of the book is devoted to “global rationality”—the rationality of persons. Not being basic, the notion of a rational person is a function of the degree to which a person is theoretically and practically rational. The general proposal is that persons are overall rational when a suitable proportion of their beliefs, desires, and actions—including those grounded in emotions—are individually rational and significantly connected with one another. Audi proposes that the “belief systems of rational persons adequately reflect their experience; their desires are appropriate to their experience and beliefs; their attitudes and emotions properly reflect their beliefs and desires; and their conduct is, sufficiently often, guided by these…elements” (226). Barring unusual circumstances, furthermore, if they have a good understanding of how others are like them in rationality, motivation, and sentience, they should have some degree of altruistic desire.

The book is elegantly written and impeccably organized. In addition to its main ground-breaking aim of providing a unified account of rationality, there is insightful and detailed discussion of a host of other arresting issues and problems such as the connections among rationality, voluntariness, and autonomy, the rationality of attitudes and emotions, and the overridingness of moral reasons. In what follows, I can merely outline an evaluation of some key elements of this original tour de force.

First, regarding altruistic desire, even acknowledging that I am just like others insofar as various aspects of rationality, motivation, and sentience are concerned, I may not care for you partly because you have beliefs and other propositional attitudes that are rational for you but radically at odds with those rational for me. To complicate matters, similarities in cognitive and conative makeup, and in outlook, fail to guarantee care. You can be radically different from me in a wealth of respects consistent with my caring deeply for you. On the face of it, then, it does not seem that cognizance on my part that, for instance, you are just like me in wanting intrinsically to enjoy certain experiences and shunning others, will “ground” care. And without caring for others, it is not clear that it is rationally demanded that I have relevant altruistic desires concerning, say, your benefits, even if I recognize that we both desire the same sort of experience for the same sorts of intrinsic qualities. One could, of course, suppose that it ought to be rational for us to care about others on recognizing their relevant similarity to us. But whether this is so, hinges pivotally on the analysis of caring. Caring, as Audi suggests, may entail wanting intrinsically things that one takes to benefit others, but I suspect that this is the tip of the iceberg. The attitude of caring about another seems to involve, additionally, being invested in that other.1 The person himself must be the object of the attitude that moves one to action.2 If this is more or less so, it is an open issue whether caring for others is rationally demanded. I may fully realize that others are similar to me in various respects, and yet, rationally, it seems, fail to care for them because they are not objects that motivate me to act. It is sensible to suppose that there are grounds to substantiate the view that caring for others is a rational requirement, but this is something that deserves further discussion.

Second, in a passage that accords with his internalist view of justification, Audi writes: “I could be the sole victim of demonic manipulation that makes my behavior eminently rational given my vivid hallucinations” (213). In the wake of this concession, it is puzzling why Audi claims that autonomy, construed roughly as one’s self-governing power to bring reasons to bear in directing one’s conduct and influencing one’s propositional attitudes (212), is a requirement of rationality. Consider a case of global manipulation in which an unwitting victim of “psychosurgery” has been transformed into a psychological twin of some person quite unlike her. Endowed with a fresh set of values, goals, and other pro-attitudes that she cannot shed, she performs actions that issue from these implanted elements. There is a transparent sense in which such a victim’s initial conduct is not under the control of her system of reasons and, thus, she fails to qualify as autonomous on Audi’s conception of self-government. Further, if autonomy, as Audi proposes, is required for rationality, her actions are not rational. But the victim of global manipulation, it seems, is just as responsive to experience as is Audi’s victim of demonic manipulation, and, hence, if the actions of the one are deemed rational, so, too, should the actions of the other. Why the asymmetry in ascriptions of rationality? Perhaps the driving thought is that rationality requires the additional constraint that the pro-attitudes giving rise to one’s actions be “truly one’s own.” This is what may underlie some of Audi’s remarks to the effect that acting on certain sorts of induced wants and beliefs undermines rationality (211-2). Rational action, then, must stem not only from rational beliefs and wants, but also from such propositional attitudes that are “authentic.” This provocative requirement calls for development and defense.

Third, as previously noted, Audi proposes that certain desires can be objectively but not subjectively ill-grounded or rational (88-9). These sorts of desire would be akin to justified but false and, hence, objectively ill-grounded beliefs. Such beliefs would be subjectively rational but objectively irrational in a manner much like the manner in which one could believe falsely (and perhaps on good grounds) that one has a moral obligation to do something, but really have no objective obligation to do this thing at all.

It is subjective moral obligation that is relevant to key sorts of moral appraisal of persons such as appraisals of responsibility. If I do something in the belief that I am doing wrong, then, provided other requirements of responsibility such as freedom requirements are satisfied, I, as the object of appraisal, can be blameworthy for doing what I did even though the deed was not objectively wrong.3 With this in mind, ponder whether it is subjectively or objectively rational beliefs that contribute to the rationality of persons.

Frankfurt-type examples in which an agent performs an action “on her own” but could not have done otherwise because, perhaps, of some fail-safe mechanism, suggest that it is subjectively rational beliefs that are of primary importance. Suppose such an agent, given her commitment to Kantian principles, believes that an act is obligatory and desires to do it for that reason. In her Frankfurt-type predicament, her action would not in fact be obligatory, since there is a requirement of alternative possibilities for obligatory action that cannot be met with the fail-safe mechanism in place.4 The agent, it would seem, would be hard to fault on grounds of being irrational with respect to doing what she did, though a crucial belief and desire that move her to action would be subjectively but not objectively rational. My suggestion, then, is that while it is reasonable to suppose that objectively ill-grounded desires or beliefs are, minimally, less rational than objectively well-grounded ones, global rationality need not be threatened or attenuated in virtue of the fact that the agent has a stock of objectively ill-grounded but subjectively well-grounded beliefs.


1. Harry G. Frankfurt, The Importance of What We Care About (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1988), p.83.

2. J. David Velleman, “Love as a Moral Emotion,” Ethics 109 (1999): 338-74, pp.356-7.

3. Ishtiyaque Haji, Moral Appraisability (New York: Oxford University Press, 1988), chs.8,9.

4. Ishtiyaque Haji, Deontic Morality and Control (New York: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming 2002).