The Argument of Mathematics

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Andrew Aberdein and Ian J. Dove (eds.), The Argument of Mathematics, Springer, 2013, 393pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400765337.

Reviewed by James Robert Brown and Kevin Kuhl, University of Toronto


Andrew Aberdein and Ian Dove attempt to bring together recent research in philosophy of mathematics that deviates from a longstanding tradition of viewing mathematics as being concerned with deductive mathematical proof. We need to say a few words about argument and argument theory before launching into a discussion of the various chapters.

As the term is used in this book, argument theory seems to mean almost any sort of non-deductive inference. This, of course, includes standard ampliative techniques from enumerative induction to Mill's methods, to Bayes's theorem. It also includes analogical inference and even reasoning from diagrams. If these techniques are allowed in physics, why not in mathematics? This book makes the case for a liberal answer. And to a considerable extent it is convincing.

If there is a debate here, then the champions of non-deductive methods have already won, with hardly a word said in their own defence. A deductive proof must start somewhere, from axioms or first principles, which are themselves not proven. Examples abound: the Peano axioms, the axiom of choice, Dedekind's characterization of real numbers, and so on. Whatever counts as evidence for the starting point must be provided in some non-deductive way. Either that or they are a divine revelation.

There is another important aspect of mathematical activity that cannot be understood in terms of deductive logic. People pick plausible problems to work on. Granting agencies fund plausible projects. Ph.D. supervisors must find problems for their students that can be solved within a couple of years, before funding runs out. As James Franklin in his article points out, the most important decision a new Ph.D. student can make is not the area to work in but the choice of supervisor, one who has a sense of a suitable problem. All of this is hugely important to young careers and to the development of the discipline. Rational decisions depend on evidence that can in no way be characterized in terms of deductive logic.

So here are two aspects of mathematics that cannot be understood without appeal to non-logical reasoning: evidence for axioms and finding problems that seem solvable. After that, however, we might insist on deductive proofs as the one and only way to establish a theorem. Should we insist on traditional rigorous proofs? This issue is the book's main focus.

Most of us would say a proof, as currently understood, is an argument. We start from premisses and follow the rules to a conclusion. It is valid when a specific condition holds: if the premisses are true, then the conclusion is true. For those who think mathematics is nothing but a fiction, this will do. But most of us want our mathematics to be true, so we care about soundness. An argument is sound when it is both valid and the premisses are true. We take theorems to be the conclusion of sound arguments. A typical published proof in a mathematical journal, however, looks nothing like a sound argument, so we often call it a "proof sketch." The ideal or canonical proof is one in which the theorem is translated into the concepts of set theory and is derived from the axioms of set theory. In short, what we do in the ideal case is show that ZFC  Thm is a logical truth. Because we accept ZFC (without proof, by the way), we detach Thm, which now stands alone as a certain truth. We often say we could in principle provide a fully rigorous proof, if pressed, but in most cases this is highly unlikely. However, even if we reject the appeal to set theory, most working mathematicians would still hold to part of the ideal claim: a proof is a logical derivation from principles and theorems that are already established. A proof sketch, the thing we see in journals, is an approximation to full derivation. It is a proof or at least a proof sketch as just characterized that is being demanded when we insist on rigour.

Is this the only way to establish mathematical results? Think of all the ways we establish results in physics, biology, or philosophy. A logical derivation is always welcome, but we embrace very much more. We allow statistical and probabilistic reasoning, we use analogies, we construct thought experiments, and so on. Why should we hesitate to use similar techniques in mathematics? Why couldn't any of these be legitimate ways of arguing for a theorem? The authors contributing to this volume think they are indeed legitimate. We will briefly describe four (out of eighteen) as a random sample.

Franklin makes an interesting case for adopting objective Bayesianism as a means for explaining non-deductive relationships between mathematical propositions. Some readers may find Franklin's replies to the standard barriers towards such a proposal frustratingly short. Franklin notes correctly that we may construct deductive and inductive inferences for the same conclusion, and that our knowledge of these conclusions may proceed independently of each other. However, this does not constitute an explanation of how there may be non-deductive evidential relations between mathematical truths that are usually taken to be necessary. Similarly, it's not clear how this translates to an effective proposal for developing a Bayesian model for mathematical reasoning, since deductive relations between propositions are assumed to be known by the ideal agent on these models. While there may be proposals for getting around this, Franklin leaves this unsaid. His other proposal consists of identifying natural mathematical properties (as in response to the grue paradox), as a means by which to skirt issues arising from the problem of induction, but it is not clear that in the mathematical realm we have the typical sorts of justifications available in terms of laws.

Richard L. Epstein develops a narrative on the nature of mathematics that takes mathematics to be the product of abstraction. According to this account, Epstein considers abstraction in mathematics to be a gradual movement towards greater levels of generality, or at least divided from ordinary science in terms of the degree of generality of its claims. The knowledge that is furnished by mathematical proofs, Epstein alleges, is of two kinds: (i) knowledge that certain propositions follow from the assumptions of the theory, or (ii) knowledge that the theory applies to other domains. In a welcome appendix, Epstein discusses how his view is similar to and divergent from similar work in philosophy of mathematics. In particular he considers deductivist views to be divergent from his own in that deductivists rely on formal proof being a fully satisfactory characterization of mathematical proof.

Dove's and Aberdein's separate chapters cover similar ground, discussing possible ways to develop theories in the philosophy of mathematics that have a significant role for argument theory and/or informal logic in the epistemology of mathematics. Dove starts from this as an explicit assumption and points to the use of computer proofs, abduction, and probabilistic evidence. Similar grounds are found in Aberdein's broader account of the matter. He discusses the role that analogical reasoning has played in Bill Tutte's disproof of Lusin's Conjecture in graph theory. Both papers hold that informal logic will play an indispensable role in an adequate philosophy of mathematics.

There is an interesting issue that is not taken up in this volume but should be considered along with the development of non-deductive proofs. What counts as legitimate evidence might depend on one's outlook on ontological issues. If one is a realist in philosophy of mathematics, then analogical reasoning could be seen as similar to analogical reasoning in, say, physics (assuming one is a realist in physics). But if one were a fictionalist in mathematics, then analogies might be problematic. Consider this analogy: Harry (a real person) is athletic and was trained in sword fighting. He is very good with a sword. Harry's father was similarly athletic and was trained in sword fighting. Therefore, Harry's father was probably good with a sword. This is a plausible analogical argument. Now consider this one: Hamlet (the Prince) is athletic and was trained in sword fighting. He is very good with a sword. Hamlet's father (the murdered king) was similarly athletic and was trained in sword fighting. Therefore, he was probably good with a sword. Is this a good inference? Harry and his father are real but Hamlet and his father are fictions. Some might reasonably say the latter analogy is not good. It does not fail because Hamlet's father might be poor with a sword, but rather because there is no fact of the matter about his sword-fighting ability. The only facts about Hamlet and his father are those Shakespeare has written into the play. There is a kind of completeness about the natural realm that a fictional realm lacks. The subject matter, real or fictitious, makes a difference. This suggests, perhaps unsurprisingly, that the nature and legitimacy of non-deductive methods in mathematical reasoning will depend in part on mathematical ontology. Analogies that work for Platonists could fail for fictionalists.

Underlying several of the articles is the following general assumption: most philosophers of mathematics take the subject matter of mathematics to be the discovery or development of formal proofs. This assumption is probably an overstatement and somewhat unwarranted. In particular, the role that argument theory or informal logic is taken to play seems to be an explanation of how mathematicians assess or justify theories. But when we look at the range of approaches involved in investigating epistemological issues, we find that the range of tools employed by philosophers of mathematics goes well beyond formal derivability. Frequently faculties such as intuition, visualization and abstraction are all employed in varying degrees, and they are tools discussed elsewhere in philosophy of mathematics. But this is a small quibble. The Argument of Mathematics is an interesting and important resource for philosophers of mathematics who have not much considered alternative kinds of evidence. The points considered by many of the authors and the argumentative structures highlighted in many of the chapters are worth further reflection in works in the epistemology of mathematics. These considerations will play an increasingly important role in future philosophy of mathematics. This welcome volume is a good place to start.