The Art of Abduction

Art Of Abduction

Igor Douven, The Art of Abduction, MIT Press, 2022, 349pp., $50.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262046701.

Reviewed by Stephen Biggs, Iowa State University


In The Art of Abduction, Igor Douven argues that abduction (i.e., inference to the best explanation) is an important mode of inference, where abduction consists in taking explanatory goodness to confirm theories (e.g., inferring the truth of the best explanation or increasing the probability assigned to theories as their explanatory goodness increases), and explanatory goodness is determined by performance across various theoretical virtues (e.g., “simplicity, scope, fruitfulness, internal coherence, coherence with background knowledge, and mathematical elegance” 54). More specifically, Douven argues that abduction is psychologically important in that it’s commonly used, and epistemically important in that it’s uses are often fundamental and rational. In making his case, Douven offers important insights into the challenges advocates of abduction must overcome, the options they have for meeting those challenges, the relationships between abduction and Bayesian reasoning, and various more general aspects of epistemology and philosophy of science, all while taking significant steps toward establishing that abduction is, indeed, both psychologically and epistemically important. The book, therefore, is valuable reading for epistemologists and philosophers of science regardless of their (antecedent) interest in abduction, and is essential reading for anyone interested in abduction—which, Douven argues compellingly, every philosopher and psychologist interested in theorizing should be.

What follows focuses on my main concern with Douven’s argumentation, while also highlighting some of the book’s strengths.

Douven (Chapter 2) introduces abduction through a collection of nice examples: Newton confirming a Dutch victory against the British, Le Verrier discovering Neptune, Darwin confirming natural selection, Thompson discovering the electron, and my favorite, Douven confirming (for himself) that a severed head found in Jackson, Mississippi came from a headless body found less than a mile away. On the one hand, it’s easy to imagine these people reasoning as Douven says that they do—i.e., as using explanatory considerations to guide their theorizing. On the other hand, because Douven (mostly) doesn’t say how these reasoners use explanatory considerations (likely because they themselves offer little on that front), it’s equally easy to imagine that each infers the truth of the theory that strikes her as most plausible, where she is so stricken because of implicit processing that entirely eschews explanatory considerations. That some of the reasoners say they infer the conclusion that best explains the evidence does little to assuage this concern, because talk of explanatory goodness might merely label perceived intuitive plausibility.

Since Douven uses these examples only to give readers a sense of what he has in mind when he talks of abduction, this concern is mild. Still, some exploration of how appeal to theoretical virtues led (or could have led) these reasoners to their conclusions would have been valuable, especially given how sparse such exploration is in the literature. Moreover, Douven’s discussion of the examples portends a trend: it’s often unclear whether abduction or some alternative mode of inference does the work Douven claims for abduction.

Consider, first, how Douven (Chapter 3) supports the claim that abduction is psychologically important. He cites a nice collection of experiments, highlighted by Douven and Jonah Shupbach’s (2015) finding that subjects’ judgments about explanatory goodness and conditional probabilities taken together predict their theory choices better than their judgments about conditional probabilities taken alone. This result seems to suggest that people use abduction to draw conclusions. But Douven and Shupbach don’t probe how subjects assign explanatory goodness. Perhaps subjects use theoretical virtues to rank theories, in which case the result shows that they use abduction. Or perhaps they use only intuitions about plausibility, where the implicit processing that produces those intuitions eschews explanatory considerations altogether, in which case the result doesn’t show that they use abduction—unless appeals to intuitive plausibility suffice for using abduction.

Consider, next, how Douven (Chapter 4) responds to a certain sort of Bayesian. Some Bayesians say that abduction is superfluous when it coincides with Bayes’s rule, and irrational otherwise. Showing that abduction is fundamental and rational requires countering this charge. Indeed, Douven thinks of these Bayesians as among his main interlocuters throughout the book, and he usefully explores various responses to this charge as well as to other Bayesian concerns. Here, I’m interested in only one of Douven’s responses to one such version of a dismissive Bayesian: Douven identifies a task for which, he says, following abduction is rational even though its dictates diverge from those of Bayes’s rule. If Douven’s assessment of this task is correct, then the dismissive Bayesian is misguided. Contrary to Douven’s assessment, however, it’s unclear that anyone uses abduction (or even could use abduction) when performing the task that he explores.

The task is to use a series of coin flips as evidence for identifying the bias of a coin that is randomly selected from a pool of eleven coins that are antecedently known to have biases of 0, .1, .2, . . .1. (The task can be thought of as choosing the correct theory, where the candidate theories at issue are that the selected coin has a bias of 0, that it has a bias of .1, and so on.) Douven compares the performance of Bayes’s rule to an alternative, EXPL, which proceeds as follows: first, EXPL adopts the probabilities assigned to theories by Bayes’s rule; second, it assigns a bonus to whichever theory best explains the available evidence; third, it adjusts the probabilities assigned to lower ranked theories to ensure that the probabilities assigned to all theories sum to 1. Since EXPL assigns a bonus to whichever theory best explains the evidence, Douven takes it to be a version of abduction.

Douven ran a series of simulations in which simulated agents using EXPL competed with simulated agents using Bayes’s rule. He found that the former typically identified the coin’s bias most quickly, although they also erred more often. Douven then argues (compellingly) that there are contexts in which a rule that trades accuracy for speed is epistemically superior to any slower, more accurate rule. Finally, he concludes that EXPL is sometimes epistemically superior to Bayes’s rule, and therefore, abduction is sometimes epistemically superior to Bayes’s rule.

This argument establishes the fundamentality and rationality of abduction only if EXPL is both a version of abduction and distinct from Bayes’s rule. Is it? One can use abduction to rank theories only if the theories perform differently along some theoretical virtue. Of the eleven theories at issue in this task, none is simpler than another, has greater scope than another, is more fruitful than another, has more internal coherence than another, coheres with background knowledge more than another, or has more mathematical elegance than another. The only standard theoretical virtue that differentiates these theories is fit with the evidence. But Bayes’s rule accounts for fit with the evidence in exactly the way that EXPL does—more on this momentarily. It’s unclear, therefore, that EXPL is any more a version of abduction than Bayes’s rule is. It’s unclear, moreover, that EXPL, as used in this task, is even distinct from Bayes’s rule. Douven sets the threshold for identifying a theory at ninety percent confidence—i.e., one can conclude that the selected coin has bias x when her chosen rule says that there’s a ninety percent chance the coin has bias x, but not before. EXPL invariably takes the theory to which Bayes’s rule assigns the highest probability and raises that probability, thereby allowing EXPL users to reach the ninety percent threshold more quickly than those who follow Bayes’s rule. Accordingly, using EXPL seems to be equivalent to using Bayes’s rule and lowering the threshold for identifying the correct theory; indeed, I expect that simulated agents who use EXPL and adopt a ninety percent threshold for drawing conclusions would perform exactly like simulated agents who use Bayes’s rule and adopt an appropriately lower threshold. If that’s right, then the dismissive Bayesian shouldn’t be moved by Douven’s simulations; rather, she should insist that these simulations don’t establish that abduction is fundamental and rational because EXPL, as used here, isn’t a version of abduction and, at any rate, reduces to Bayes’s rule.

A similar concern arises for Douven’s more expansive arguments for the fundamentality and rationality of abduction (Chapters 6–7). Those arguments are based on further tasks in which simulated agents using alternatives to Bayes’s rule outperform simulated agents using Bayes’s rule. These simulations establish the fundamentality and rationality of abduction only if some of the simulated agents are using abduction. Are they? Bayes’s rule already invokes the only consideration the alternatives do, i.e., fit with the evidence. Accordingly, these alternatives are only versions of abduction if Bayes’s rule is already a version of abduction. Moreover, as before, using one of the alternatives, EXPL, is equivalent to using Bayes’s rule and lowering one’s threshold for drawing conclusions. So, again, it’s unclear that the simulations show anything about abduction.

In sum, I am left wondering whether some of Douven’s central arguments are about abduction: his argument that abduction is psychologically important might be about intuitive plausibility, and some of his central arguments that abduction is epistemically important might be about the relative merits of various thresholds for drawing conclusions when using Bayes’s rule (and perhaps also about the relative merits of various kinds of non-abductive, probabilistic reasoning). Although I’ve framed this concern as an objection, one can think of it as an invitation for Douven to explain why, despite this concern, one should think that his experiments and simulations are about abduction.

In principle, this concern can be mitigated within the experimental paradigms Douven deploys. Douven and Shupbach could have asked subjects to explain their rankings of explanatory goodness. The results would have shown that subjects use abduction when assigning probabilities if subjects’ answers had included appeals to theoretical virtues that Bayes’s rule doesn’t incorporate, but not if subjects were unable to explain their rankings, and not if their rankings were based entirely on considerations that Bayes’s rule already incorporates. And Douven could have sought problems for which EXPL beats Bayes’s rule even though EXPL does more than assign a bonus to whichever theory Bayes’s rule ranks highest (where the bonus is based entirely on considerations that Bayes’s rule already incorporates). If he had been able to find such problems, then he would have shown that abduction is fundamental and rational—at least, as compared to Bayes’s rule. (For anyone interested in pursuing such simulations, Douven provides all the necessary tools in an appendix, where he explains in detail how to conduct such simulations using only open-source software.)

Despite this concern, Douven paints a largely plausible picture. He argues compellingly that the epistemic standing of a mode of inference depends on how it performs for an agent in an environment with a goal, and therefore, abduction is fundamental and rational if it outperforms every competing rule for some agent-environment-goal triple—or at least does well enough for some such triple. The antecedent of this conditional is plausible even though it’s unclear that Douven’s simulations support it. After all, the antecedent is true if for some agent, abduction can deliver robust results when other modes of inference can’t, when the inputs to other modes of inference are comparatively obscure, or when factors that other modes of inference ignore (perhaps, e.g., simplicity) are relevant to theory choice.

Why does Douven develop his simulations in detail and only mention (or merely intimate) in passing such alternatives ways of supporting a crucial premise in his argument? Douven seems to want to establish that using abduction instead of Bayes’s rule can be rational even when (i) the two deliver competing results, (ii) the inputs to Bayes’s rule are entirely clear, (iii) no further inputs are relevant to theory choice, and (iv) the reasoner at issue is entirely competent with Bayes’s rule. If successful, his simulations would have established this robust conclusion. But it’s unclear that his simulations could have been successful, because it’s unclear that using abduction instead of Bayes’s rule can be rational when (i)–(iv) are satisfied. It’s unclear, moreover, why he wants so much more than is required to show that abduction is commonly used, fundamental, and rational.

Douven (Chapter 8) does pursue in detail one way of establishing that abduction is epistemically important that doesn’t invoke simulations. He provides a strategy for showing that given minimal premises (premises that even the Cartesian skeptic should endorse) one can simultaneously support the conclusion that abduction is epistemically important and provide the Cartesian skeptic with reasons (that she should accept) to move toward realism. Douven’s argument is too elaborate to explore here, but I encourage readers interested in skepticism or the value of abduction to explore it for themselves.

All things considered, the book is poised to accomplish what Douven takes its mission to be: “The book will have accomplished its mission”, he maintains, “if philosophers and psychologists of reasoning find some motivation in it to start considering abduction as being at least worthy of more attention than it has been given in the last twenty-five years or so”, even if not “all readers agree with each and every argument [he has] given” (262). Anyone who reads the book should find the motivation Douven aims to provide. Whether they should moreover be persuaded that abduction is psychologically and epistemically important is less clear, although I take Douven to provide, at a minimum, plausible strategies for establishing just that.


Douven, I. and Shupback, J.N. 2015. Probabilistic alternatives to Bayesianism: The case of explanationism. Frontiers in Psychology 6,