The Art of Comics: A Philosophical Approach

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Aaron Meskin and Roy T. Cook (eds.), The Art of Comics: A Philosophical Approach, Wiley-Blackwell, 2012, 213pp., $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781444334647.

Reviewed by Brandon Cooke, Minnesota State University, Mankato


Comics and film are roughly the same age, and have similar origins as popular entertainment media. And yet, film has been a topic of respectable philosophical study for more than half a century, while comics, until now, have been almost wholly unexamined. While this difference in treatment is easily explained (consider film's comparative success in establishing itself as a "serious" art form), it does nothing to justify comics' philosophical neglect, if comics and their associated creative and appreciative practices generate philosophical questions of significance.

The ten contributors to The Art of Comics make this case decisively, and the reader is left wondering (or at any rate, this reviewer was left wondering) why it took so long for our collective enterprise to focus attention on comics. Many of the issues examined arise in other areas of the philosophy of art, to be sure, but comics present some special puzzles of their own.  Study of those puzzles puts pressure on the dialectic of other debates in aesthetics that have not taken comics into account. This collection thus serves as a check against philosophical parochialism.

Meskin and Cook's  substantial introduction gives a helpful concise history of comics as well as a survey of scholarship about comics. The references complied here will be an invaluable starting point for anyone wishing to conduct research in the aesthetics of comics. The essays themselves are grouped into three sections: the nature and kinds of comics, comics and representation, and comics and the other arts. Regrettably, my comments on the main contents of the book are necessarily brief and less than comprehensive.

The first essay, "Redefining Comics" by John Holbo, opens with a claim that exemplifies an uncertainty about the book's audience found occasionally throughout the collection: "We all know McCloud's definition [of comics]: 'juxtaposed pictorial and or other images in deliberate sequence, intended to convey information and/or to produce an aesthetic response in the viewer.' But do we like it?" (p. 3) You might be included in that "we" if you work in this area of aesthetics, or had picked it up from the preface. But it's a rather jarring opener in a book aimed at both the small group of comics philosophy specialists and other philosophers.

At any rate, a philosopher's first instinct at seeing such a claim is to search for counterexamples. Holbo does just this, not so much to show that McCloud's definition is wrong, but to show that just about any item exhibiting graphic design counts as a comic. So paintings and illuminated manuscripts count, but this is not intended as a reductio ad absurdum. He sets aside with little argument Aaron Meskin's historical definition, which limits the category to those items we would unreflectively label as "comics", excluding paintings, novels, and illuminated manuscripts. But the primary claim is undermotivated, bolstered not so much by argument as by woolly, underdeveloped suggestions. It's difficult to know how to evaluate the case being made, or just what the case is. Above all, it's hard to see what is gained by understanding "comics" so inclusively.

Things look up in the second chapter, "The Ontology of Comics" by Meskin. His focus is not the most basic ontological category of comics, but rather the status of comics within the category of artifacts. As with several of the contributions, Meskin draws on distinctions made by Kendall Walton in his seminal "Categories of Art" (Philosophical Review 79, 1970: 334-367), between features that are standard, contra-standard, and variable for the artistic category. Meskin argues that for comics multiplicity is a standard feature. This is not to say it is a necessary condition, but an item that could not have multiple instances would likely fail to be a comic if it also failed to possess a number of other standard features of comics. What distinguishes comics from novels, which also are multiples? A novelist's original manuscript is an instance of the novel; it is an exemplar. But the original art or the engraved plates used in the production of a comic are not exemplars, but rather encodings. Still, despite their basic connection to a mass production process, comics are nevertheless autographic in the sense that there can be forgeries. A perfect copy of a comic will not count as an instance of it unless it has the right connection to the authorized production process. Though Meskin's concern is ontological, the position he develops squares much better than Holbo's with the distinctions we properly make between comics and non-comics.

The third chapter, "Comics and Collective Authorship" by Christy Mag Uidhir, extends a debate about film authorship into the comics arena. The basic issue is that most mass-art comics involve a number of contributors, each of whom makes a distinctive artistic contribution: the writer, the line artist, the inker, and the letterer. Comics connoisseurs follow the work of these contributors and hold it up for independent appreciation. So perhaps, then, these contributors should be counted as authors, and collective authorship should be seen as the norm for comics.

Indeed, Mag Uidhir argues that this is typically the case. Since a full review of his argument is not possible here, I draw attention to what appears to be its crucial premise:

A is the author of w as an F if and only if A is directly responsible, at least in part, for w's possession of the features in C  [where C is the] set of all and only those features essential for work-description F (p. 53).

To concede this definition of authorship gives away the game. It's hard to see how one could block the claim that a letterer with a distinctive style could fail to be an author by this definition. In contrast, consider a more neutral definition such as the one Paisley Livingston defends in his Art and Intention (Oxford University Press, 2005):

author = (def.) an agent who intentionally makes an utterance, where the making of an utterance is an action, an intended function of which is expression or communication (Livingston, p. 69).

Using this pragmatic definition, whether a letterer turns out to be a co-author turns on whether in this instance the letterer acted on executive-level intentions to make a certain utterance, intentions that were shared with the other authors of the work and entailed meshing plans. So sometimes the letterer will be a co-author, sometimes not. Simply making an essential artistic contribution (as an actress might make to a film) is insufficient for co-authorship. Mag Uidir writes in a footnote that his view of authorship is developed elsewhere, but since the core issue before us is whether and when comics are collectively authored, it would have been useful to have recapitulated the case here. As is, it's hard not to see much of the work in the argument as being done by an unargued-for premise.

Although Thomas Wartenberg ("Wordy Pictures") doesn't invoke Walton's "Categories of Art", he argues in effect for the claim that a standard feature of comics is a certain intimate relationship between text and image.

a distinctive feature of comics is that the images and text both contribute at an equally basic level to their story worlds. Neither the text nor images have a more fundamental role than the other, but they work together to create the story-world of the comic (p. 97).

So the claim is that neither the text nor the images of comics are more fundamental in determining what is (fictionally, in the case of a fiction comic) true in the world of the comic.

Wartenberg recognizes that this fundamental equality is not necessary for something to count as a comic, hence my suggestion that this is offered as a claim about a standard feature of comics in a Waltonian sense. On Walton's view, a standard feature is not the exclusive property of an art form that possesses it, and so cannot serve as a self-sufficient criterion for distinguishing one art form from another. But Wartenberg expresses confidence that the typical equality of text and image in comics (again, in determining what is true in the world of the story) is distinctive of comics, and not found in other art forms.

A large part of his case lies in differentiating illustrated books from comics. With the former, according to Wartenberg, the text is primary in determining what is true in the story world, and the images must be faithful to the text. Wartenberg recognizes that the images here can impute properties that are not explicitly described by the text -- indeed, this is surely almost always the case, as we can see if we compare a textual description of a person with an illustration of that person. The text will almost certainly underdetermine certain features of the person that the illustration makes definite.

Here one wonders whether the issue of co-determination really is a distinctive feature or comics, or even typical. Much depends on the particular details of the production of the work, and who the work's authors are in the sense of having executive control over the work's expressive content. In cases where the writer has this control, the illustrator is not free to contradict those facts that are determined by the text, even if she adds to them. This hardly seems different from the case of illustrated books as Wartenberg describes it. And in the case of non-fiction comics such as Logicomix: An Epic Search for Truth, many facts are set before writers and illustrators get down to work, though in the world of Logicomix some of the story facts are not those of the real world. Russell, Wittgenstein, and company had already lived their lives, and the truths of logic and mathematics have always been true, even if the comic implies additional facts about the story world, or contradicts others, as when it has Russell meeting Cantor.

So it seems mistaken to think that even so loose a constraint as being a standard feature is what text-image equality is for comics. Rather, we need to proceed on a case-by-case basis and take account of the relationships between writer and illustrator, determining who has executive control over the content of the work. Sometimes what Wartenberg says about comics will be true, but not always.

Neither is it true that only comics have the text-image relationship that Wartenberg attributes to them. He considers and dismisses illustrated books as the likeliest challenger to his exclusivity claim, but I can think of at least two other strong candidates: original fiction films and plays. In both cases, the script (or script with directions, if you like) underdetermines the work-represented facts about the story world; how the characters and settings are represented (by what the actors do and what the camera records, say) is often equally fundamental in determining what is true in those story worlds.

On the whole, The Art of Comics is an excellent book, and will no doubt be the starting point for interested analytic philosophers for years to come. The book is well-illustrated, which may partly explain its prohibitive price. A less expensive paperback edition would make a great supplementary text in an undergraduate philosophy of art course, as many of the recent debates in analytic philosophy of art make an appearance here. Even when I found myself in disagreement with a contributor's argument, I was often struck by the writer's passion for and knowledge of comics. The book is also a real success at shedding new light on many long-standing problems in aesthetics. On top of its other achievements, Meskin and Cook's anthology establishes beyond any doubt that comics merit philosophical study as much as they do carefree enjoyment.