The Art of Life

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Kekes, John, The Art of Life, Cornell University Press, 2002, 288pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0801440068.

Reviewed by Stephen Watt, The Open University


John Kekes attempts in this book to discuss one way in which life may be lived well. He does this by analyzing a specific type of good life, that which consists in practising the art of life to achieve personal excellence.

The book falls into three sections. Part one consists of a discussion of various types of concrete good lives of personal excellence. Kekes gives five types of such a life: those of self-direction, decency, moral authority, depth and honour. Each life forms the basis of a chapter, with the main focus of each chapter being on a particular life, actual or fictional, which embodies the value in question. Thus, for the life of moral authority, Kekes examines the life of the sophron (wise man) in the Cypriot village of Alona and for the life of depth, he examines Oedipus as portrayed by Sophocles. Part two examines in four chapters the general conditions for practising the art of life and develops some of the ideas which emerged from the examination in part one. Part three, the final chapter, draws together the threads of the various arguments to provide ’one possible and reasonable approach to living a good life’ (p10):

The resulting view is that one way of making lives good is the successful practice of the art of life. This requires living and acting in conformity to a reasonable ideal of personal excellence and developing a well-integrated dominant attitude (p239).

Given that Kekes is arguing only that the sort of life he presents is one possible good life, not that it is the only good life, it is on the goodness of that life that I am going to concentrate. In particular, I am going to suggest that the absence of an adequate conception of practical wisdom or phronesis and a consequent lack of engagement with the rationality of ends pursued undermines the goodness of this life.

Kekes has, over the years, written a number of books all of which tend to argue in favour of an approach to ethics that both emphasizes a concern with good lives rather than actions and, broadly speaking, favours conservative values rather than liberal ones. The present book draws heavily on these preceding works. As such, Kekes’ approach is clearly related to that of many modern ethicists who take their inspiration from classical ethicists, particularly Aristotle. However, Kekes distances himself deliberately from the Aristotelian approach to ethics in at least two ways. Firstly, he carefully distinguishes the personal excellences that he is concerned with from Aristotle’s moral virtues. Secondly, he aims only to give an account of one possible way of living well, and makes no claims about the general suitability of this life for all human beings.

Assessed purely as a matter of Aristotelian exegesis, Kekes’ basis for distinguishing his personal excellences from Aristotle’s moral virtues appears unsatisfactory. He gives Aristotle’s definition of a moral virtue as follows:

a moral virtue is (a) a character trait that is (b) concerned with choosing actions, (c) based on reason, and (d) aiming at the mean between excess and deficiency (pp164-5).

He goes on to argue that his personal excellences, whilst character traits, do not fill conditions (b) (c) and (d) and are therefore not moral virtues in Aristotle’s sense. They are not concerned with choosing actions, because, for people who possess that excellence, it may be ’psychologically impossible for them to choose a contrary action’ (p165). They are not concerned with reason because they do not always or usually involve critical reflexion on the traditions they find themselves in or the ends they are pursuing:

For More took for granted the Catholicism that formed him; the [Cypriot] sophron had not reflected critically on his Hellenic-Byzantine-Greek Orthodox tradition (p167).

Finally, unlike the moral virtues, personal excellences cannot be cared about too much:

If people are committed to lives of self-direction, moral authority, decency, depth, or honor, then it is hard to see how they could be said to feel too strongly their desire for self-mastery, love for the tradition that nourishes them, benevolence towards others in their context, passion for understanding, and sense of obligation (p168).

As an account of what Aristotle believed to be involved in the moral virtues, Kekes’ discussion is inadequate. Comparison with, for example, what Aristotle actually says in his definition at 1106b36-1107a3 in the Nicomachean Ethics will quickly reveal those inadequacies. It would be, for instance, extremely odd to think that, when Aristotle talks of choice in this connexion, he is thinking that the courageous agent could somehow choose not to be courageous. This is, however, of little consequence in itself: Kekes is not trying primarily to give an account of Aristotle but rather to explain what his personal excellences are like. So putting aside questions of how well Kekes has interpreted Aristotle, how well do personal excellences, so characterized, serve as constituents of a good life?

From the above, we are to imagine that people can live a good life without an awareness that they could have acted otherwise, that they can live a good life without critical reflexion on the tradition they find themselves in, and that they cannot care too much about the excellences they care about. Kekes does acknowledge the role of reflectiveness in his good life, but says little about it in this work.1 What he does say suggests that one main function is to realize the arbitrariness of that tradition:

Reflectiveness is directed also toward understanding that the vision of one’s own moral tradition is merely one among many. To have this kind of understanding is to see that here, as Peter Strawson puts it, “there are truths but no truth.” It is the essential feature of a pluralistic society that it is generally recognized in it that the morally acceptable visions of a good life are many. The fact remains, however, that of the many only one is one’s own. (p52)

To help me deal with these aspects, I’m going to focus on the life of Thomas More, which Kekes in his first chapter takes as an example of the life embodying the personal excellence of self-direction. Before getting into the details, it’s worth pointing out that Kekes’ coverage of the details of More’s life takes up only about two full pages of the book. I say this, not so much as a criticism of Keke—one of the most attractive aspects of The Art of Life is indeed its illuminating reflexion on a variety of concrete cases—but rather to expose the unavoidable limitations of his approach: the cases considered are not given in sufficient detail to motivate -let alone test - the accounts given, but function rather to illustrate those accounts. Putting this aside, More is used to illustrate the nature of unconditional commitments which Kekes describes thus:

Unconditional commitments are the most serious convictions we have. They define our limits: what we feel we must not do no matter what, what we regard as outrageous and horrible. They are fundamental conditions of being ourselves. Unconditional commitments are not universal, for they vary with individuals. Nor are they categorical, for we may violate them. But if through fear, coercion, weakness, accident, or stupidity we do so, we inflict grave psychological damage on ourselves (p21).

More’s unconditional commitment was to the ’priority of his religious beliefs’ (p20). Such unconditional commitments are to be contrasted with ’defeasible commitments’ (p22).

The difference between them [i.e. defeasible commitments] and unconditional commitments is that nothing we recognize as a good reason could override the latter because our judgments of what reasons are good and how strongly they weigh are dictated by unconditional commitments. They are the standards by which we measure, and unless we abandon the yardstick, there could be no rational consideration that would incline us to reject conclusions that have been properly derived from our unconditional commitments (ibid).

In More’s case, his (defeasible) commitments to family and king were overridden by his unconditional commitment to his religious beliefs.

This appears to me to be an unfounded psychologizing of More’s commitments. More gave up his life because God is more important than king. Given the sort of thing that More as a Catholic supposed God to be, it would be unwise and cowardly to give in to threats of a bullying king to betray God. If the dispute were instead about the abolition of fox hunting, and More gave up his life rather than break his unconditional commitment to being a huntsman, then More would have been a fool rather than a saint. The psychological strength or otherwise of a commitment isn’t the issue here: the issue is whether or not the commitment is to something worth dying for—a question answerable only by application of something like Aristotelian practical wisdom.

This question of unconditional commitments appears linked to what Kekes, in the second section of the book, calls dominant attitudes (chapter 8). More had a ’dominant attitude to self-direction’ (p190). This means that, in some sense, his attitude to the personal excellence of self-direction structured his personality:

The dominant attitude, therefore, determines what really matters. It is not just the central but also a pervasive influence on the beliefs, emotions, and motives that constitute people’s attitudes toward their lives (ibid).

Whether a commitment to self-direction informs More’s character in general is of course a matter for detailed biographical argument, but certainly it seems to be an entirely inadequate explanation of the actions which led to his execution. More did not see the circumstances of his time just ’as formidable obstacles to living the life he wants’ (p192).2 If he did, he arguably should not have died for that. If More died for the sake of self-direction, or for a dominant attitude valued not because of its goodness, but because it was simply his dominant attitude, then it’s not clear he should have done that. Only if he died for God—whether or not one accepts the truth of his beliefs—do his actions make sense.

If you turn back to Aristotle, the differences between him and Kekes appear helpful here. Aristotle too talks of structuring a good life around a dominant end, but anything less than the end of living well appears to him inadequate.3 Moreover, that living well, as we learn in Book X, is in some way bound up with the political community or contemplation of divine things. It is noteworthy that both God and state—the usual things people think worth dying for—seem generally disregarded by Kekes, presumably because they transcend the psychology of the individual.

Let’s go back to the three differences between Aristotelian virtues and Kekes’ personal excellences mentioned earlier:

1) The psychological impossibility of choosing otherwise.
2) The absence of reason in the choosing of personal excellences.
3) The impossibility of overvaluing personal excellences.

For any given individual, it is undoubtedly the case that all three of these may hold true and yet the life remain good. But in Aristotelian terms, this is surely because such lives are directed by others: due to weakness in their own intellects (or by force of circumstances such as lack of leisure) their good life is achieved by taking on trust the deliverances of the practical wisdom of others4 . In a self-reflective individual like More, however, the possibility of such an absence in a good life seems less convincing. More could not have chosen otherwise because he was standing for what he believed to be true against what he believed to be false: it is no more a matter of psychology than the belief in 2+2=4. (And had he changed his mind on the truth of those beliefs, he could—and should—have chosen otherwise.) As argued above, if he decided that his dominant attitude would be an unconditional commitment to his religious beliefs, that is because his religious beliefs were thought by him to be such things as demanded unconditional commitment. A similar unconditional commitment to, say, honour might be striking, but it might also be foolish (as Don Giovanni’s refusal to flee the Commendatore is striking but leads him to Hell). The possibility of overvaluing personal excellences, even dominant ones, is always there: it could quite reasonably be argued that More placed too much weight on his religious views and too little on his—in Kekes’ terms—defeasible commitments to his family. What you think of his weighting ought to depend on what you think of the truth of his religious views. And this involves the application of practical wisdom to the assessment of the goodness of his ends.

There is much of value and interest in the book. In particular, the first section containing the discussions of concrete lives is frequently illuminating and thought provoking. Where it is particularly strong is in its depiction of lives of integration lived in the midst of chaos. And of that sort of life, Montaigne—another concrete life dealt with in the book—is a rather better example than More. For ultimately, More did not think he lived in a chaos, but in a transcendent order that was worth dying for and which would persist whatever he or anyone else did. Kekes’ vision appears to be of an order that can only exist through the imagination and will of human beings: hence his psychologism. If that vision is correct, then Kekes’ account of a good life gains plausibility. But if that vision is doubted—as it is in those traditions which acknowledge an order transcending the psychology of individuals, for example, either in the state or in God—then the ends of his good life can appear arbitrary and self-willed. For this reason, I suspect that Kekes’ aim of finding a life which can be seen as good from the viewpoint of all traditions is chimerical. The Art of Life, however, remains overall a welcome contribution to the positive trend within modern ethics to move away from abstract theorizing towards the particular and concrete.


1. Kekes refers us to his Moral Wisdom and Good Lives, Ithaca, Cornell University Press, 1995. Whether this work does adequately supplement what is said in the present volume I shall leave for others to decide.

2. Kekes uses this phrase to characterize the possible attitude of the self-directed to the French Revolution not to that of More. However, it does seem intended to capture something essential in the dominant attitude of people, such as (in Kekes’ eyes) More, committed to the excellence of self-direction.

3. I am thinking here of the discussions in Book I of the Nicomachean Ethics which argue for eudaimonia (living well) as the target of actions, and for the inadequacy of commonly held characterizations of that target as honour, or wealth or pleasure.

4. I take this to be the kernel of philosophical truth in Aristotle’s notorious discussions of slaves and women in the Politics.