The Artful Species: Aesthetics, Art, and Evolution

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Stephen Davies, The Artful Species: Aesthetics, Art, and Evolution, Oxford University Press, 2012, 301pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199658541.

Reviewed by Peter Godfrey-Smith, The Graduate Center, CUNY


What sort of human product is art? Is it an expression of our biological nature, or a cultural overlay? Does art have a core function, in a strong sense of that term that stems from evolutionary history, or is what we call "art" just a set of practices that people find rewarding for various disparate reasons, and a minor player in the prehistory of our species?

Stephen Davies's book is a clear, judicious, and valuable treatment of these questions, considering many angles and reaching no firm conclusions. It also makes rich connections to questions about other human aesthetic responses -- our appreciation of landscapes and animals. The main thing I'll do in this review is describe a combination of ideas that I see as a reasonably promising sketch of the evolution of artistic behaviors. I arrive at this view by combining elements of two theories that Davies discusses and rejects -- the theories of Aniruddh Patel and Ellen Dissanayake -- and modifying them with the aid of other ideas emphasized in recent evolutionary theory. The result is a view of art based on gene-culture coevolution. This view seems to do a fairly good job with the data Davies puts on the table, and while he is careful and fair-minded in laying out the options, he sets up the landscape in a way that makes the resources of a view like this harder to see. So I'll make some critical comments about his set-up, and then outline the positive view.

What might art be? What are the options? As Davies sees it, there are four main possibilities for our art-related behaviors:

First, they might be adaptations, that is, transmissible capacities that increased the fitness of those who displayed them so that their possessors parented more extensive and far-reaching lineages. Examples of adaptations are the oxygen-fixing qualities of blood and development of feathers in birds. Second, they might be by-products or spandrels, that is, adventitious side-effects of adaptations without adaptive significance in themselves. Examples of spandrels are the navel and the redness of blood. Or third, they might be vestiges, that is, currently non-functional features that were functional either in the species' earlier development or for a precursor species from whom they were inherited. Examples of vestiges in humans are the appendix, which played a role in digestion for a distant herbivore ancestor, and the coccyx, which is the remnant of a tail.

A fourth possibility is provided by the negative hypothesis -- that there is no significant connection between art and evolution. The relation between evolved adaptations and art behaviors might be so distant and thin that it would be misleading to claim an interesting or explanatorily fruitful link between them. . . . Many behaviors -- the making of fire and the wearing of clothing, for example -- are widespread because they are culturally passed down for their usefulness, not because we are genetically programmed to express them. (p. 45)

This "negative" fourth hypothesis is not negative in general, but only about the connection between art and biological evolution; this view is that art is instead a culturally transmitted technology.

Having laid out these options, Davies immediately sets aside the third, the "vestige" hypothesis, because art has too powerful a role in our lives for this view to be likely. He is also quick to set aside his fourth option:

I . . . intend here to discount the negative fourth option -- that there is no explanatory relation between art, the aesthetic, and evolution. . . . I am reluctant to endorse views that treat biology and culture as separate domains with very little causal interaction between them, and some such separation is presumed in this view. (p. 46)

As Davies finds in the course of the book that none of the three remaining options handles all the data well, at the end he reaches a somewhat negative conclusion:

If technology, spandrel and adaptation [and vestige] exhaust the logical space of possibilities, as I believe they do, it looks as if something has gone wrong. (p. 184)

The problem in this treatment involves the fourth option, the idea that art is a culturally transmitted technology. Davies says he does not find this view attractive, because (as he puts the point again later) it "presupposes a clearer division between cultural development and the forces of evolution than I think is plausible" (p. 158). However, although there can be an art-as-technology view that sees "no significant connection" between evolutionary processes and art, this is not the only option, and not the best option.

A useful comparison is with the cooking of food: how does cooking fit into the taxonomy above? Is it an adaptation, a spandrel, a vestige, or a technology in the sense of something with "no significant connection" to evolution?

Cooking is very old (here I draw on Wrangham 2009). It is pretty likely 200,000 years old (roughly the age of our species), and maybe as much as 2 million (the age of our genus, Homo). Cooking was invented/discovered, probably many times. It is passed on by social learning; one person picks it up from another. Once cooking is in place, it affects our diet, and once diet is changed, this profoundly affects our bodies and our brains. Our bodies are affected because cooked food is softer and easier to digest. Our gut gets smaller. Our senses and brains are affected because smell becomes less important, and -- somewhat more controversially -- cooked food is higher-quality food that runs a higher-powered brain.

These effects of cooking are effects on biological evolution; the changes to the gut and the sense of smell are genetic changes. These changes occur because new genetic mutations arise and become more common. Those mutations are advantageous, though, because of the prevalence of socially learned behaviors. The mutations would not be useful otherwise. So cultural changes affect selection pressures, which then affect the biological evolution of our bodies and brains.

In principle, it could then happen that further mutations arise that make cooking behaviors themselves easier to acquire -- perhaps in such a way that cooking eventually arises reliably in each individual without other cooks functioning as models. The behaviors become unconditional -- or rather, much less conditional -- in their appearance. That is a form of "Baldwin effect" (Weber and Depew 2003). You might then ask: why should this last stage occur? If cooking were already going on, why would cooking-mutations be favored? That is a fair question, and the reply would have to involve something like the importance of quicker and more reliable acquisition. In any case, this step has apparently not occurred in the case of cooking. Though cooking has changed our bodies, it still has to be learned.

Is cooking then an adaptation? A spandrel? It is not an adaptation in the usual biological sense. It is a "technology", if that is something contrasted with biological adaptation. But cooking is responsible for adaptations, and it is evolutionarily important. We have evolved to be the way we are partly because we cook. So cooking is a technology in something related to Davies's sense, but it is not a technology that has (in his phrase) "no significant connection" with evolution. Cooking is a learned behavior that is also embedded in our biology.

Davies does discuss gene-culture coevolution in his book, but his taxonomy of the options, outlined above, does not have a natural home for it. "Technologies" are treated in the book as disconnected from biological evolution, rather than -- in some cases -- interacting with it.

Next I'll discuss a more general topic within evolutionary theory, and how Davies handles it. When thinking about practices like art, a question that quickly arises is what role there might be for group-level advantage, a Darwinian selection process operating on groups. From the 1960s onwards, there was a backlash against explanations of this kind in biology, responding to over-use in an earlier generation (Williams 1966, Dawkins 1976). Intermediate views have since arisen (Okasha 2006). It is clearly possible for collective entities, groups of various kinds, to succeed in an evolutionary context through the cooperation and even self-sacrifice of lower-level parts that could, in a sense, go their own way; our multicellular bodies are examples. Natural selection can act at many levels, and often does so simultaneously in the same system. Davies accepts this, but he associates a particular idea with group selection explanations of social behavior: "groups persist and flourish as the result of social rather than biological transmission." (p. 36)

Many claim that aesthetic or art practices are evolutionarily significant because they benefit the group. That is, these theories adopt a commitment to multilevel selection theory and depart from the classical Darwinian model of evolutionary explanation that focuses on individuals or their genes. This . . . account is thereby weakened in explanatory power. This is because genetic inheritance provides a strong explanation of the faithful replication of beneficial traits over the long term, assuming the environment is stable; whereas the preservation of group benefits relies on cultural transmission, which is less accurate and reliable (pp. 43-44).

This is not right. There are many kinds of multilevel evolutionary models. Some make use of genetic means for inheritance, others are cultural, and yet others use mixtures of genetic and cultural transmission (Bowles and Gintis 2011). Further, even if group-level transmission processes are less "accurate" than genetic inheritance between individuals, this does not show that those group-level processes are thereby "weakened in explanatory power" -- or, at least, that they must be weak causal factors. The cultural inheritance of languages and norms can be enormously important.

Explanations in terms of group benefit are often associated with altruistic behavioral patterns. Genuine altruism -- giving away resources or making sacrifices -- does require special explanation in an evolutionary context. A number of recent discussions of the role of groups in evolution emphasize the role of mutualistic, as opposed to altruistic, behaviors, though. There are various ways of making this divide, but one important consideration is whether a social behavior has a "free rider" problem. Once most people in a group are engaging in some practice, is it most advantageous for an individual to opt in, or opt out? Are there benefits to be gained from shirking one's responsibilities in a collective project, taking the fruits of others' labors, or would this instead be self-defeating for the individual? Mutualistic behaviors are in the second category. These patterns of behavior may be hard to initially establish, as they require much coordination, but once the pattern is in place, each individual benefits from going along and there is no problem of free-riding (Skyrms 2005, Tomasello 2009, Sterelny 2012). Cooperative hunting is an example. Another is communication. If no one is listening, there is no point in talking. But once communication is going on, it's advantageous to be part of it. As a result, an evolving population may have both a no-communication equilibrium state, and a communicative one. Similarly, both cooperative hunting and non-cooperative hunting may be equilibria; both patterns of behavior are stable once they are prevalent.

When Davies discusses the advantages that art might have in processes of selection, his main options are sexual selection (competing for mates) and group selection of a strong kind that involves altruism. But mutualistic behaviors are important possibilities. Some behaviors especially relevant to the origins of art here are ritual behaviors, and coordinative activities in a group such as chant and dancing. Critical mass may be needed for such a behavior to be worth doing, but once it's going on, there is no reason not to be part of the practice. You may then ask: why is there a role here for group-level selection, if the behavior is individually advantageous in these ways? In response, the following scenario is an important possibility: different communities reach different equilibria with respect to these behaviors, but some of these practices benefit the communities as a whole, with respect to inter-group competition, resistance to extinction, and use of resources, while other equilibria are inefficient, and liable to harm the group's viability. Then group-level advantage has an important role in change even though individuals in successful groups need not be exhibiting "altruism."

I'll look now at Davies's discussion of two theories that others have offered of the relation between art and evolution. Davies rightly takes these views more seriously than he takes various others, though he argues against both.

The first is due to Patel (2010). Patel applies his view specifically to music. He opposes the idea that music is a genetically based adaptation. Music, Patel says, is a technology, like fire. Once present, music changes our brains. It changes them in ontogenetic time, the time-scale of individual development. But music is a transformative technology. Once we have it, there is no tendency to go back. Music stays around, by social learning, and changes the brain of each individual exposed to it. Patel's view, as I said, is just about music, but it might be expanded.

Dissanayake's theory (1992) is applied to all art. She thinks that art is a biological adaptation with a genetic basis. Its function involves group benefit through social bonding. Psychologically, artistic behaviors are built on certain kinds of mother-child interactions. These set up the possibility of ritualistic behavior acquiring a more general and very powerful role. The arts expand from there, through the development of many ways of "making special" ordinary objects and behaviors.

Dissanayake's view and a generalized version of Patel's view differ about the transmission of art-related behaviors over time, and the role of genetics and individual development. But it is not hard to set up a view that combines both -- some genetic and some non-genetic transmission. And then the following option is available: a Patel-like view describes how we do something and a Dissanayake-like view tells us why we came to do it.

Here is a hypothesis of that kind. Art-related behaviors spread initially by social learning and through mutualistic benefits. The mutualistic benefits might be roughly the ones Dissanayake describes, where art-related behaviors are linked to ritual and early religion, and give rise to adaptive social cohesion. They may also (as Noël Carroll, forthcoming, suggests) facilitate the transmission and retention of cultural habits, values, and forms. A good way to learn how to behave in a culture is to learn its songs. In the case of cooking, a transformative technology has advantages that are fairly individualistic. If no one else is cooking, it is still a good idea to do it. In the case of art-related behaviors, the benefits are more social in nature.

From this point, there is also the possibility of genetic change. Various slight changes to our brains and bodies become advantageous in the new social environment, changes that would not be worth having in a different context. Some of these may be changes to the supporting physiology. In that case there is not genetic assimilation of the behavior itself -- a Baldwin effect -- but the evolution of better biological scaffolding for a learned behavior. Other changes, though, may make the behaviors themselves easier to learn and more reliable in their appearance. The chance of such mutations arising is not affected by the new social context, but their value is. Language is a case where these sorts of things may well have occurred, and some art-related behaviors are another. Here are some data given by Davies against Patel, who resists a genetic account of musical development in the individual:

Pitch-structured, metrically regular vocalizing emerges earlier than five years of age in the child's development. In fact, children begin to sing songs structured in terms of melodic contour rather than tonality from about eighteen months. Such behaviors appear to be self-motivating and often unprompted, which suggests the environmental triggering of genetic dispositions. (pp. 154-55)

If this is how things are, it is compatible with my version of the coevolutionary view.

Are there further problems with the view I have sketched? Davies does have other arguments against the positions of Patel and Dissanayake and some of these criticisms might be relevant here. For example, Davies objects to Patel's analogy between fire and music:

As actions or behaviors they [fire-related behaviors] do not form a coherent class. As a result, our focus falls naturally on the product, fire, rather than on its causes and the behaviors that activate them.

Music behaviors are importantly different from this, I think. They are unified with each other and with the product, music. . . . Even if we were inclined to agree that fire should be counted as a transformational technology, we could have reservations about characterizing music in such terms, because it is continuous with the processes that cause it, rather than being product-focused. (pp. 155-156)

I don't think these differences matter greatly to the hypothesis outlined here, though they may affect some details of the interaction between cultural and genetic change. Suppose we say that music is a transformational behavior rather than a transformational technology. This I see as a relatively minor difference. (And if fire is a transformational technology, cooking is a transformational behavior.) Regarding Dissanayake's view, Davies is skeptical about the role she gives to group-level as opposed to individual-level advantage. But as noted above, Davies has too constricted a view of what group-level selection might be able to do. Here again, it is relevant to keep in mind the models developed by Boyd and Richerson (2005), Bowles and Gintis (2011), and others: models of scenarios where various human groups reach different equilibria with respect to social behaviors (via both genetic and cultural transmission), but some groups end up in better places than others, with respect to the cohesion and vitality of the group as a whole.


This review is based on a paper given at the Pacific Division Meetings of the American Philosophical Association, 2013. I am grateful to Steven Davies, Noël Carroll, and members of the audience for helpful comments.


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