The Atrocity Paradigm: A Theory of Evil

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Card, Claudia, The Atrocity Paradigm: A Theory of Evil, Oxford University Press, 2002, 284pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195145089.

Reviewed by Philip L. Quinn, University of Notre Dame


This book is the second major philosophical treatise in recent years that focuses on problems to which very great evils give rise. The first was Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God by Marilyn McCord Adams. According to her definition, horrendous evils are “evils the participation in which (that is, the doing or suffering of which) constitutes prima facie reason to doubt whether the participant’s life could (given their inclusion in it) be a great good to him/her on the whole” (M.M.Adams, Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God, Cornell University Pres, 1999, p. 26). Her examples of horrendous evils include such things as the rape of a woman and axing off of her arms, parental incest, and the explosion of nuclear bombs over populated areas. Horrendous evils are of special philosophical concern to Adams because of the threat they pose to the rationality of belief in God’s goodness. Adopting R.M. Chisholm’s distinction between balancing off and defeating evils, she lays down two conditions on divine goodness: “At a minimum, God’s goodness to human individuals would require that God guarantee each a life that was a great good to him/her on the whole by balancing off serious evils. To value the individual qua person, God would have to go further to defeat any horrendous evil in which she/he participated by giving it positive meaning through organic unity with a great enough good within the context of his/her life” (Adams, p. 31). The formidable task Adams sets for herself is to work out a logically possible scenario in which God satisfies both of these conditions.

Claudia Card undertakes a contrasting project in secular moral philosophy in the book under review here. As she tells the reader in its introductory chapter, her interest in evil is motivated by atrocities that have occurred during her own lifetime. They include the following events: “the Holocaust; the bombings of Hiroshima, Nagasaki, Hamburg, and Dresden; the internment of Japanese Americans and Japanese Canadians during World War II; the My Lai massacre; the Tuskegee syphilis experiments; genocides in Rwanda, Burundi, and East Timor; the killing fields of Cambodia; the rape/death camps of the former Yugoslavia; and the threat to life on our planet posed by environmental poisoning, global warming, and the destruction of rain forests and other natural habitats” (p. 8). Card takes atrocities to be paradigms of evil “(1) because they are uncontroversially evil, (2) because they deserve priority of attention (more than philosophers have given them so far), and (3) because the core features of evils tend to be writ large in the case of atrocities, making them easier to identify and appreciate” (p. 9). Constrained by this choice of paradigms, she identifies the core features of her conception of evil in the following definition: “An evil is harm that is (1) reasonably foreseeable (or appreciable) and (2) culpably inflicted (or tolerated, aggravated, or maintained), and that (3) deprives, or seriously risks depriving, others of the basics that are necessary to make a life possible and tolerable or decent (or to make a death decent)” (p. 16). In the definition’s third condition, tolerability is to be understood as a normative concept. For Card, a tolerable life “is at least minimally worth living for its own sake and from the standpoint of the being whose life it is, not just as a means to the ends of others” (p.16). Card does not devote much space to reflection upon the theological problems of evil, though she does at one point claim that her account of evil “makes sense of what is morally at stake in the theological problem of evil, but without solving it and without presupposing either theism or atheism” (p. 13). However, she sometimes fails to adhere strictly to the theological neutrality advertised in this claim. Thus, for example, she remarks that “natural events—earthquakes, fires, floods—not brought about by or preventable by moral agency are not evils” (p.5). But earthquakes, fires, and floods are preventable by the moral agency of the omnipotent deity of traditional theism, and so this remark does presuppose atheism. Card asserts: “My theory presupposes no such agency, but can be adapted for those who do” (p.5). We may grant that she is correct in claiming that her theory does not presuppose that there is a divine moral agent, which is to say it does not presuppose theism, and so would need to be adapted for those who do presuppose the existence of God. The remark I have quoted, however, does presuppose that there is no divine moral agent, which is to say it does presuppose atheism. The slip represented by this departure from Card’s advertised theological neutrality is, in my opinion, only a minor blemish on the book.

Despite large differences between their projects, the views of Adams and Card converge on two significant points. First, the classes of evils they target for special philosophical attention overlap to a considerable extent. The destruction of Hiroshima and Nagasaki by atomic weapons is reckoned by Adams to be a horrendous evil and is counted by Card as an atrocity. Second, as their respective definitions indicate, they are interested in the evils in the targeted class at least in part because of the threat they pose to the overall value of the lives that include them. For Adams, horrendous evils provide prima facie justification for doubt that the lives of those who are participants in them can on the whole be great goods to them. And for Card, evils deprive, or seriously risk depriving, those harmed by them of things needed to make their lives good enough to be worth living from their point of view. This convergence suggests that a detailed comparison of Adams and Card on evil would yield some interesting philosophical fruits. Unfortunately, a book review is no place for such a comparison. So in the remainder of this review I shall restrict my attention to Card’s discussion of evil.

After having outlined her account of evil in the book’s introduction, Card devotes three chapters to defending it against challenges that might be mounted from other philosophical perspectives. Chapter 2 is a critique of Nietzsche’s denial of evil. Card considers it unfortunate that “Nietzsche’s approach to evil in his Genealogy of Morality has been successful, in secular circles, in effecting a general shift away from questions about evildoing and evil practices to psychological questions about why people have wanted to use the concept of evil, what hidden agendas they may have, and how they can thereby manipulate others” (p.23). In order to counteract this shift, she attempts to separate the insights from the prejudices in Nietzsche’s discussion of evil. She holds that his important insights include the claims that judgments of evil come chiefly from a victim’s perspective, and that they are often accompanied by a distorting hatred, and perhaps also the view that such hatred is often rooted in fear of impotence. But she criticizes “the beliefs (1) that the perspectives of the weak are more distorted and yield more dishonest judgments than those of the powerful, (2) that powerful perpetrators are not likely to hate their victims, and (3) that hatred underlies judgments of evil” (p. 29). It seems to me that Card is on the right track in insisting that our attitude toward the perspective of victims of evil should be neither systematically dismissive nor sentimentally credulous.

Chapter 3 argues that the definition of evil Card advocates can successfully steer a course between the extremes of utilitarianism and stoicism because it takes into account both the culpability of perpetrators of evil and the harm they do to their victims. Her main complaint about utilitarianism in its classic Benthamite form is that it fails “to place independent value on agents and on willing (agency), that is, value independent of the suffering or harm one’s choices may cause” (p.51). This is, of course, a well-known objection, but its familiarity does not undermine its power. Following Martha Nussbaum, Card takes the fundamental idea of stoicism to be “that good character, good willing, or good agency is the most important value (for extreme stoics, the only thing that is truly good), along with the corollary that it is a mistake to place great value on contingencies, on what eludes or exceeds our control (for extreme stoics, that such things have no true value at all but are ’indifferent’)” (p. 66). She protests against the tendency of stoicism, thus understood, to devalue suffering and compassionate responses to it as well as its neglect of the possibility of harms that do damage to the will itself. This objection too is familiar, but none the worse on that account. I am inclined to quibble with Card over a small point she brings up in this chapter. She lumps together ascetics and the severely depressed, conjecturing that they “may subject or expose themselves to such hardships because they have ceased to care, or think they deserve no better, or perhaps to prove they can do it” (p.63). No doubt there are ascetics who satisfy this uncharitable description. But clearly many religious ascetics subject themselves to real hardship because they judge that doing so puts them on the best path toward very great spiritual goods. Card’s failure to see this is one of the very few instances of lack of sympathetic imagination to be found in this book.

In Chapter 4, Card grapples with the account of radical evil set forth in Kant’s Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason. As she understands it, Kant’s theory is basically stoic in its values because “it implies that the sufferings of victims are just incidental, not part of what makes evil deeds evil” (p.73). She is also dissatisfied with Kant’s claim that it is, and must remain, inexplicable to us why anyone freely adopts the evil principle of subordinating the incentive of duty to self-interest as a supreme maxim of conduct. If there is a mystery here, Card urges, it “should be expressed as why any of us makes supreme whatever principle we make supreme, whether the moral law, self-interest, or even something else” (p.78). She then goes on to propose a solution to Kant’s mystery that invokes Christine Korsgaard’s notions of self-conceptions and practical identities and the idea of attachment to important persons and their internalized representations (IPIRs) found in the work of the psychologist Lorna Smith Benjamin. In Benjamin’s approach to treatment of personality disorders, the patient is helped to become aware of attachment to one or more IPIRs. And as Card puts it, “once aware, the patient can choose to endorse the attachment, try to disengage, or negotiate a different relationship with the IPIR” (p.91). It seems to me, however, that Benjamin’s ideas shift the Kantian mystery to another place without actually solving it. If the choice between endorsing and trying to disengage from an IPIR is as fundamental as the choice to adopt a supreme principle of conduct, and if it is a libertarian free choice for which the patient is accountable, as Kant insists such fundamental choices are, then it will be inexplicable to us why patients make the choices they do, whether endorsement, endeavoring to disengage, or renegotiation.

After bringing her account of evil into conversation with some of its philosophical rivals, Card turns in Chapter 5 to what I take to be the chief practical payoff she hopes to derive from highlighting evil in her moral theorizing. She proceeds to argue that “feminists and other political activists working for social justice or liberation should give priority to addressing evils over the goal of eliminating unjust inequalities” (p. 96). In the course of her discussion of feminism in this chapter, she makes the interesting point that American feminists have been divided between those who, in the majority tradition of Susan B. Anthony and Elizabeth Cady Stanton, have given priority to achieving equal rights and those who, in the minority tradition of Charlotte Perkins Gilman and Emma Goldman, give priority to ending oppression. There is obvious poetic justice in Card’s advocacy for the stance on priority of the minority tradition, since she is Emma Goldman Professor of Philosophy at the University of Wisconsin in Madison. The most difficult question she tackles in this chapter is explaining what it means to prioritize evils; it cannot sensibly mean neglecting lesser injustices until all greater evils have been eliminated. Card’s view is that “prioritizing evils does mean, at least, making sure that significant attention is devoted to them, whatever else we do” (p. 106). In the course of spelling out this view, she points to helpful analogies with giving priority to family over work and with prioritizing research over teaching, which is an example that is sure to be salient for university professors.

The next two chapters are devoted to case studies of atrocities. Chapter 6 covers war rape and the related evil of wartime sexual slavery. Card’s discussion emphasizes and tries to explain the fact that until recently these evils have been relatively invisible. She argues that several factors contribute to the explanation, including death, shame, and fear on the part of the victims and the insensitivity produced by distance on the part of those most responsible for sexual slavery in such instances as the “comfort women” enslaved by the Japanese military during World War II. Card reports in this chapter some of her fantasies about penalties for rape, which she envisages being inflicted primarily in wartime. Her principal fantasy penalty, “motivated by a vision of something like poetic justice in which the crime bounces back on the perpetrator, was compulsory transsexual surgery, that is, removal of the penis and testicles and construction of a vagina, accompanied by whatever treatments may be advisable for the sake only of bodily health and integrity” (p. 133). A modification of this fantasy penalty, which she aptly calls “Bobbitizing,” would be “to eliminate construction of the vagina and stop after removing the penis, producing more of an ’it’ than a transsexual” (p.134). Card makes it clear, let me hasten to add, that she is opposed to the legal enactment of such fantasies, but she says she would not support their realization “because their humane administration would require the participation of health care professionals” (p.135). I confess to some ambivalence about the role these fantasies play in Card’s larger argument. On the one hand, it may be necessary to say something shocking to get some men to appreciate how seriously Card thinks the evil of raping women should be taken. On the other, the cruelty of the fantasized punishment, which Card herself acknowledges in passing, may result in the sort of rhetorical overkill that is counterproductive. And, in any event, she is surely right when she goes on to observe that “the fact that there are also male victims of sexual abuse in war shows that these fantasies and the currently popular understanding of war rape suffer from too narrow a view of the nature and motivation of the crime” (p.135).

Card also resorts to shock tactics in her discussion of the evils of domestic violence in Chapter 7, which bears the provocative title “Terrorism in the Home.” She tells the reader that this phrase is meant “to refer to spousal battering and ongoing sexual abuse of children” (p. 143). The chapter’s main thesis is this: “The relations defined by marriage and motherhood trap victims of terrorism in the home. They pose serious obstacles to escape by granting perpetrators enforceable intimate access to victims and extensive control over the knowledge and access of others” (p.140). And, in the book’s introduction, Card candidly asserts that the chapter “argues for the abolition of marriage and motherhood (as institutions), in favor of alternative forms of durable intimate partnerships and child rearing” (p.25). An alternative to the legal institution of marriage that Card finds attractive would involve contracts in which “intimate partners committed for a specified length of time, to be determined and renewable only by mutual consent” (p.157). She also advocates more distributed forms of child rearing, drawing for inspiration on the idea of revolutionary parenting proposed by bell hooks and thoughts about compensated caregiving expressed by Eva Feder Kittay.

I think Card performs a valuable service in focusing attention on the way in which the institutions of marriage and motherhood raises issues in what she describes as the ethics of access and in bringing her abolitionist proposals to the table for discussion. I am willing to grant that current institutions of marriage and motherhood make it harder to detect and stop spousal and child abuse than might otherwise be the case, precisely because of the way in which they restrict access to what transpires within family units. But she does not address the full range of issues that would need to be confronted before a rational decision to adopt some alternative to currently existing institutions could be reached. In the case of marriage, some of them involve religion. For a large fraction of the people of the world, marriage is an institution primarily governed by religious norms and not by the rules of civil law. Such people will reasonably insist that the legal institution of marriage should reinforce or, at least, not seriously undermine the religious institution, and many of them would regard an attempt to impose on them alternative arrangements that reflect Card’s secular liberal values as an intolerable infringement on their religious freedom. As the example of Hindus and Muslims in India shows, permitting different systems of family law for different religious communities in a pluralistic society respects religious liberty but is likely to exacerbate political conflict. Card’s discussion simply fails to consider the political costs or feasibility of moving to alternative legal forms of intimate partnership. In the case of motherhood, empirical questions about the consequences of more distributed forms of child rearing demand attention. We do not know what impact they would have on the lives of people brought up under them. Card does not assess the evidence from studies, for example, of Israeli kibbutzim. In short, her argument in this chapter gives us only an opening statement in what would have to be a complex and difficult debate.

Even if we were to prioritize addressing evils, it is unlikely that we would succeed in eliminating them. Hence moral reflection on how to live with evils is important, and Card takes up this topic in the next two chapters. Chapter 8 concentrates on the moral powers of victims, which she identifies as blame and forgiveness. Her treatment of forgiveness seems to me to be particularly insightful. Card operates with a conception of ideal interpersonal forgiveness in which “there is a change of heart in the offended party regarding the offender, which consists of (1) a renunciation of hostility out of (2) a charitable or compassionate concern for the (perceived) offender; (3) an acceptance of the offender’s apology and contrition; (4) a remission of punishment, if any, over which the forgiver has authority or control; and (5) an offer to renew relationship (to ’start over’) or accept the other as a (possible) friend or associate” (p.174). She devotes a good deal of effort to reflecting on cases that depart from the ideal in various ways. When she considers unrepentant offenders, for example, she concludes that “there comes a time when it is good for victims to let go of resentment, even if there is no basis for compassion for the offender” (p. 175). I agree that it is good for victims eventually to endeavor to free themselves from resenting unrepentant evildoers, when this will help them move beyond being obsessively preoccupied with injuries they have suffered. When this happens, however, victims try to rid themselves of resentment wholly for their own sake, not for the sake of the reconciliation with those who have harmed them, and so I wonder whether such acts should be counted as cases of forgiveness. As Card points out, a reason for considering such efforts to be genuine forgiveness, at least when they succeed, is that they involve a real change of heart and include “renunciation of something that underlies blaming, namely, the sense of injury and the hostilities that go with it” (p. 177). But a reason to the contrary is that they need involve no transaction with, or even communication to, the evildoer.

Chapter 9 is devoted to the moral obligations and burdens of perpetrators; it pays particular attention to the obligation of gratitude for forgiveness or mercy and the burden of guilt. Unlike many other contemporary philosophers, Card sees value in feelings of guilt because they can serve to motivate reparative activities. She develops her defense of guilt by means of an interesting comparison with shame. Some of the contrasts between them that she views as morally significant are these: “Guilt includes the idea of owing, whereas shame includes that of dishonor or humiliation. In expiating guilt, we seek respect and reacceptance. In removing shame, we seek esteem or admiration” (p. 206). With some differences between guilt and shame thus delineated, Card goes on to claim that “an advantage of guilt is that when it is not excessive or obsessive, the confessions, apologies, restitution, and reparations that it tends to motivate can remove cause for continued resentment” (p. 207). By contrast, the achievements that remove shame may create grounds for admiration and yet do nothing to eliminate grounds for resentment or to make reparations for harms done. A controversial aspect of Card’s treatment of guilt is her endorsement of certain forms of what is often called “blameless guilt.” An example is survivor guilt, which she defines as “a form of guilt over involuntary unjust enrichment, that is, involuntarily benefiting from injustices done to others by others” (p. 202). Card agrees with Herbert Morris that survivor guilt so defined is a kind of blameless guilt that is not irrational. Apparently she holds this view because she thinks that survivor guilt can motivate those who suffer from it to aid the victims of the injustice that produced the benefits or the victims of similar injustices or to struggle against the kind of injustice involved in producing the benefits. A white descendent of slave owners who felt guilty on account of benefits derived from injustices his ancestors visited upon their black slaves would satisfy Card’s definition of survivor guilt. And she seems to be committed to accepting examples of this sort, since she speaks in this context of knowing “at least one philosopher descended from slave owners who has devoted much of his career to work on the concept of social justice” (p.203). No doubt it is good that Card’s acquaintance has worked on the concept of social justice. But if he was motivated by feelings of guilt over benefiting from the injustices done by his slave-owning ancestors, then I would say he was irrationally motivated. After all, he is not blameworthy or guilty in the matter of those injustices and presumably knows this to be the case, and so it would be irrational for him to feel guilty over them. Those who think otherwise might do well to reflect that they would almost certainly not exist unless some of the great evils of human history had taken place. Feeling guilty over their own existence would thus seem to be not irrational for them if they consider their existence to be a benefit they enjoy.

The book’s final chapter discusses what Card calls “diabolical evil.” As she indicates, her conception of diabolical evil differs from Kant’s view that it is wrongdoing for its own sake and is not possible for humans. She invites us to “regard diabolical evil as knowingly and culpably seeking others’ moral corruption, putting them into situations where in order to survive they must, by their own moral choices, risk their own moral deterioration or moral death” (pp. 211-212). She argues that evil of this sort is aptly thought of as diabolical because Satan is traditionally depicted as a moral corrupter. Following Primo Levi, who called areas in Hitler’s death camps where prisoners were given limited authority over other prisoners “the gray zone,” Card contends that the deliberate creation of gray zones exemplifies diabolical evil if anything does. She also suggests that instances of the so-called “Stockholm Syndrome,” notably the case of Patricia Hearst and her SLA captors, involve the creation of gray zones. Interestingly, Card at one point entertains the idea that gray zones mark limits to our capacity to understand and evaluate human affairs in moral terms. She asks: “Are there really always right and wrong choices in such situations (where voluntariness is not the issue)? Are there always responsible or excusable choices (where rightness or wrongness is not the issue)? Is there always such a thing as the agent’s real motive? Does our moral vocabulary fail to mark distinctions that we should want to make, to capture the way things really are? Would gray zones cease to be gray, if we had more fine-tuned concepts? Or are some gray zones ineliminable” (p. 226)? However, as if to provide an antidote to the moral paralysis that might be induced by such poignant but skeptical questions, Card goes on to affirm that “people who have lived under the extreme stress of gray zones have often not abandoned the categories of morality, nor ceased responding in moral ways emotionally, nor ceased entering relationships of trust and holding one another responsible” (p. 227). I consider the evils Card views as diabolical particularly unnerving. It has long seemed to me a comforting feature of the perspectives on morality offered by Kant and Stoicism that there is deep inside us an inner citadel, to borrow a phrase from the title of Pierre Hadot’s commentary on Marcus Aurelius, to which we can retreat in order to preserve the core of our moral personalities from the assaults of evil. Reflection on diabolical evil in Card’s sense makes it painfully clear that the comfort to be derived from the thought of such an inner citadel being invulnerable from corruption may to a large extent be built on illusion.

In this review, I have discussed the main themes of Card’s book at considerable length, and mentioned some of my own reactions to her views, in order to convey to readers an idea of how rich and stimulating the book is. What I cannot communicate in a review is a sense of the nuances of her judgments about a large array of particular cases of evil. One of the book’s great strengths is the detailed knowledge she has of the victims of many kinds of evil. This expertise is, of course, the result of a lot of hard work. As Card notes in her preface, she has at the University of Wisconsin been involved for quite some time in the interdisciplinary areas of Women’s Studies, where she has done teaching and research on lesbian issues and Environmental Studies, and she has recently begun teaching in the area of Jewish Studies. The book amply confirms the view that these areas of study are valuable sources of data for moral reflection.

In a blurb on the dust jacket of the book, Susan Wolf is quoted as saying that Card’s discussion is “genuinely wise.” Ordinarily, I would advise taking the puffery on a book’s dust jacket with a grain of salt. But, in this case, I think no exaggeration at all is involved in the claim that the book contains a good deal of wisdom.

In sum, this is an excellent book. I recommend it very highly to any philosopher who is interested in the topic of evil. Even those who share my reluctance to follow Card in setting aside theological concerns when we think about evil can learn a lot from reading it. Doing so may serve to reinforce our sense there is little hope of complete liberation from evils in Card’s sense until the coming of the Kingdom of God. In the meantime, however, it appears that God has given humanity the vocation of struggling against these evils, and Card’s book can help to guide us to where our efforts are most urgently needed.