The Austrian Contribution to Analytic Philosophy

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Mark Textor (ed.), The Austrian Contribution to Analytic Philosophy, Routledge, 2006, 328pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415404051.

Reviewed by Thomas Uebel, University of Manchester


That Analytic Philosophy all along has not been a purely Anglo-American affair rooted in British empiricism, but also has deep roots in German-language philosophy can be considered to be well-established ever since Michael Dummett published a series of lectures given in Bologna in 1987 as The Origins of Analytical Philosophy (1993).   Dummett's historical focus lay on the anti-psychologistic impetus of the "linguistic turn" he located in Frege's Grundlagen and the methodological consequences of the "extrusion of thoughts from the mind" -- "common to Bolzano, Frege, Meinong and Husserl" -- for philosophy.  For Dummett, Brentano, whose name is missing here, figures in this development not only due to his later repudiation of his own earlier views concerning the intentional inexistence of objects of thought, but even more so because that earlier view set a problem which Frege, Meinong and Husserl sought to solve in various ways.  Whether that anti-psychologistic orientation was wholly followed by all analytic philosophers -- for instance, Russell -- is debatable, but the centrality of Bolzano, Frege, Meinong and Husserl for the linguistic turn in analytic philosophy is not.  Apart from his throw-away remark that in light of the "historical context in which analytical philosophy came to birth … it would better be called 'Anglo-Austrian' rather than 'Anglo-American'", Dummett did not pursue further the historical questions which his lectures had brought to wider attention.

That there should be such a thing as a distinct Austrian tradition was proposed rather by Rudolf Haller who defended two theses:

first, that in the last 100 years there has taken place an independent development of a specifically Austrian philosophy, opposed to the philosophical currents of the remainder of the German-speaking world; and secondly that this development can sustain a genetic model which permits us to affirm an intrinsic homogeneity of Austrian philosophy up to the Vienna Circle and its descendants.

First published in 1968 (translated in 1988), Haller followed up in numerous studies his initial thesis which, with Bolzano as forbear, drew a line from Brentano not only to the theorists mentioned by Dummett (with the exception of Frege, of course), but also to the school of Twardowski in Lvov and which, importantly, includes Mach and his successors at the University of Vienna as well as Wittgenstein (see also his 1986 collection).  Due to Haller's self-conscious replication of the historical genealogy which Neurath contributed to the Vienna Circle's manifesto -- Die wissenschaftliche Weltauffassung. Der Wiener Kreis (1929) -- this thesis has also become known as the "Neurath-Haller-Thesis" and received elaboration in two collections edited by J. C. Nyiri (1981, 1986).

The Neurath-Haller-Thesis received its perhaps most sustained support in Barry Smith's Austrian Philosophy (1994) which, however, focused on the detailed reconstruction of the non-positivist wing of this tradition as represented by its subtitle The Legacy of Franz Brentano.  Leaving the precise nature of their influence on Mach, Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle as a topic for other investigations -- as well as the nature of Bolzano's input -- Smith provided in-depth analyses of the philosophical contributions of Brentano, his students and their students in turn in Austria and Poland.  In a sense, the book under review, Mark Textor's The Austrian Contribution to Analytic Philosophy, continues where Smith left off.  On the one hand, it offers a collection of essays spanning a great variety of topics but unified by concentration on authors from the Austrian tradition as highlighted by Smith and supplemented at both historical ends by attention to Bolzano and Husserl, respectively.  Bolzano features centrally in six, Brentano and Meinong each in four, Husserl in three of the essays; others, like their students Reinach, Witasek, Marty and Ehrenfels, also put in significant appearances.  On the other hand, the emphasis tends to lie on comparative analyses of the Austrian contributions with more recent work in analytic philosophy.  Following a brief overview and introduction by the editor, the volume begins with two papers in the philosophy of mind, then features three papers in epistemology and metaphysics, then three in logical theory and concludes with one each on political philosophy and aesthetics.  After characterising each contribution I will turn to the question of what precisely unites the articles in this collection.

Tim Crane's analysis of Brentano's concept of intentional inexistence convincingly shows that much of what contemporary philosophers of mind call "Brentano's problem" was not at all a problem for Brentano when he famously wrote in 1874 that "every mental phenomenon is characterised by … what we might call … reference to a content, direction towards an object (which is not to be understood as meaning a thing) or immanent objectivity".  Following Barry Smith and Peter Simons, Crane explains that at that time Brentano was a "methodological phenomenalist": he believed that science can only study phenomena and under this conception the intentional object relation was relatively unproblematic.  Only later, in additions to a reprint of Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint in 1911, did Brentano add that mental relations cannot but have really existent things as their relata and therewith raise the problem that bears his name.  Brentano's brief discussion of this problem then adds little of value for contemporary philosophers of mind, Crane concludes.

Keith Hossack discusses Reid and Brentano on consciousness.  Both share the view that an experience and the consciousness one has of it involve only a single mental event, but both give different accounts of this identity.  Hossack argues that Reid's account is preferable for it responds better to three central problems in the theory of consciousness: the status of qualia, the issue of the necessary co-occurrence of experience and consciousness of it, and the problem of introspection.  Since Reid accepted that experiences have intrinsic non-representational properties, qualia, that determine what the experience is like for the subject, he was able to assert the literal identity of an experience and of consciousness of its quale and, in turn, treat introspection as self-knowledge due to the consciousness we have of the qualia of our experiences.  By contrast, Brentano did not acknowledge the existence of qualia and equivocated on the issue of their necessary co-occurrence; finally, by equating mere consciousness with appearance, not knowledge, he was forced into accounting for self-knowledge by calling upon the infallibility of accompanying judgements -- which, Hossack argues, involved him in commitments to untenable principles that Reid easily avoids.

Fabrice Teroni focuses on an under-discussed aspect of Meinong's work, his theory of memory.  For Meinong, memory -- hereby occurrent mental states are meant -- was a species of judgements based on presentations, more or less sensory experiences.  (Meinong's discussion thus excludes procedural and propositional memory.)  Teroni criticises Meinong's own argument for his version of this position and substitutes a slightly different one: instead of Meinong's indirect realism (judgements about past experiences) Teroni adopts a direct realism (judgements about the past).  Memory judgements are not directly evident, however, so they have to be justified indirectly raising problems of circular reasoning (appealing to what in turn relies on memory).  Meinong's solution was to abandon the idea that memory judgements require or are typically amenable to conclusive proof and instead to conceive of them as "conjectures".  Teroni defends Meinong against Brentano's probability-based criticism and interprets his as a position of fallible foundationalism, based on particularism, with the distinction between being justified and being able to display that fact thrown in for good measure.  Accordingly, memory judgements have "direct conjectural", i.e. defeasible, evidence.  While Teroni stresses that Meinong opposed (pure) externalist theories of memory, it does turn out, however, that he combined internalist and externalist elements in his analysis of knowledge by memory.

Staying in the epistemological domain, Kevin Mulligan presents a survey of the "philosophy of primitive certainty", in particular in Husserl, Max Scheler, Ortega y Gasset and Wittgenstein.  Mulligan shows that for these philosophers primitive certainty differed from knowledge and critical belief: unlike in cases of the latter, for primitive certainty no justification can be given.  (This, of course, is subjective primitive certainty; Husserl also distinguished an objective version, but the idea of objective certainty mostly finds application only to knowledge or critical belief.)  Moreover, distinct types of this non-objective certainty were distinguished by different phenomenologists: naive cognitive certainty, naive affective and conative certainty, and the practical counting on something.  Their lack of justification notwithstanding, primitive certainties are held by their advocates to be basic to human functioning, yet at the same time they are said to lie outside of what Mulligan calls "epistemic projects".  (This position is expressed well in Wittgenstein's "On Certainty".)  A problem lurks here, Mulligan notes, if, like Husserl, one does not recognise practical primitive certainties and instead regards non-objective naive cognitive certainty as darkly directed at objective primitive certainties: why should these not count as instances of primitive knowledge?  A related issue concerns the systematicity of the primitive certainties: what precisely distinguishes their systems from systems of beliefs?  Mulligan also notes the failure of all but Reinach to have considered the opposite phenomenon of primitive uncertainty: it is the latter, Mulligan suggests, which "wears the trousers" in this phenomenological couple.  A survey of candidates of non-objective primitive certainty follows, including perception in Husserl, "taking practical account of things" independently of perception in Scheler, various indexical and existential judgements in Wittgenstein, the presupposed environment of intended actions in Ortega y Gasset, and one's own psychological states and one's meaning intentions generally.  The discussion of the possibility of normative primitive certainties concludes the paper: Ortega's claim that rules and norms of all kinds are primitively certain and Wittgenstein's that semantic rules are so are traced back to Scheler's practical primitive certainties.  Ortega's example of political legitimacy finally provides another argument for Mulligan's claim that primitive certainties are constituted by the absence of the even more basic primitive uncertainties.  The specification of how that notion is related to our ordinary epistemic concepts is presumably left for another paper.

Peter Schnieder moves into metaphysical territory with the discussion of the development of the idea of particularised attributes, or tropes, in Bolzano, Meinong and Husserl.  Noting that canonical designators of particularised attributes are definite descriptions, not singular terms, Schnieder concedes right away that arguments for particularised attributes, even if they outwardly follow the form of arguments for the existence of properties, are considerably more complex and so leave room for alternative construals that deny the need for particularisation or proceed in terms of facts.  Pursuing the parallels with the argument for properties from the analysis of the logical form of statements like "Red is a colour", Schnieder analyses arguments found in Meinong's Hume-Studien and Bolzano's Athanasia and his Wissenschaftslehre and finds only one of Bolzano's conclusive.  With the existence of particularised attributes established, Schnieder turns to the question of the uniqueness of their bearers (asserted, for instance, by Bolzano) and presents an interpretation of an argument of Brentano's Kategorienlehre that solves some central puzzles by making mereological distinctness of substances the crucial criterion in arguments for bearer-uniqueness.  The essay concludes with the warning that bearer-uniqueness does not, however, distinguish all particularised attributes from non-particularised attributes.

Peter Simons provides an overview of "Austrian philosophers on truth", featuring Bolzano, Brentano, Marty, Meinong, Husserl, Twardowski, Wittgenstein, Schlick, Neurath, Carnap and Popper.  Simon criticises Bolzano's argument for the existence of truths in themselves and bemoans his "whimsical" view on the subject-predicate form of propositions, but stresses that his theory of truth was "a century ahead of its time and still stands up remarkably well to the most rigorous scrutiny".  Brentano's views are shown to have shifted considerably.  Early on he held that the primary bearers of truth are judgements, individual datable acts (not propositions as in Bolzano), and he defined truth via evidence; in his late phase, this shifts to concrete judgers (with the role of evidence remaining the same).  Marty is noted for his retention of the middle-period Brentano view that judgements are true if they correspond to judgement-contents, the ontological correlates of judgements, and false if they do not.  Meinong's "objectives" are shown to represent an alternative development of the middle-Brentano/Bretanian view: they are both truth-bearers and truth-makers such that a judgement is (made) true if its corresponding objective subsists and false if it does not.  Husserl's correspondence theory of truth in Logical Investigations likewise adopted a special category of objects the role of which it was to render claims true: states of affairs.  It was this realistic conception that most influenced his phenomenological students, Simons notes and then shows that this realism also characterises Twardowski and his school.  On account of lacking a uniform relation of correspondence between propositions and reality, Wittgenstein's theory of truth in the Tractatus is then said to be a realist but not a correspondence theory; still, atomic propositions are "true or false depending on what there is" and the name "picture theory" is upheld as correct.  Simons stresses the limitations of the Tractarian theory of truth but finds it useful as far as it goes; by contrast, Wittgenstein's deflationary turn in his middle years is received coldly.  The paper closes with brief notices of Schlick's correspondence theory, Neurath's (supposed) coherence theory, Carnap's deflationist conception and Popper's correspondentist interpretation of Tarski's semantic theory of truth.

Wolfgang Künne's paper shifts back to detailed exegesis in his discussion of Bolzano's conception of analyticity.  Starting from an explication of Bolzano's definition of truth and his conception of validity (and Lukasiewicz's criticism thereof), Künne first presents Bolzano's definition of analyticity "in the broader sense" in Wissenschaftslehre sect. 148 and shows that for Bolzano, under this construal, a synthetic proposition can entail an analytic proposition and vice versa.  Künne then turns to Bolzano's definition of analyticity "in the narrower sense" or "logical analyticity".  Since a proposition satisfies this definition only if it contains at least one non-logical notion, everything depends on what logical concepts are for Bolzano.  But even given Bolzano's rather wide understanding of the term, many of the propositions considered analytic in ordinary parlance today turn out to be non-analytic for him and Künne discusses the consequences of this idiosyncrasy and ways of containing them.  The comparison of Bolzano's and Kant's definitions of analyticity shows that not every logically analytic truth in Bolzano's sense is analytic in Kant's sense for, amongst other things, Bolzano rejected Kant's implicit autarky conception of analyticity (that the truth of analytic propositions depends on nothing but their meaning and structure): Kant's and Bolzano's conceptions of analyticity are radically different therefore.  Comparing Bolzano's account of analyticity with Quine's account of logical truth, Künne finds parallels despite their different ontological commitments, though not as many as the designation of Bolzano as his precursor would lead one to expect.  Like Bolzano, Quine recognises no such thing as "the" logical form of a sentence or proposition and his definition of logical truth also has the consequence that it qualifies as analytic some statements that depend on the truth of existence assumptions.  (But Bolzano held analytic truths generally to depend partially on the "objectuality" of the proposition in question.)  By contrast Ajdukiewicz's conception of accepted meaning rules is shown to be quite different: unlike Bolzano's and Quine's, his was an epistemic definition of analyticity.  A brief discussion of how the remaining differences between Bolzano and Quine should be assessed concludes Künne's tour de force.

Edgar Morscher compares Bolzano and Carnap on a closely related notion, that of the synthetic a priori.  Comparing Bolzano's and Carnap's definitions of analyticity, Morscher notes that while for both Bolzano and Carnap a proposition or sentence is analytic if it is true due to its logical form alone, their accounts differ because both have different concepts of logical form (Bolzano rejecting the idea of a proposition possessing a unique logical form).  From this it follows, Morscher argues, that Carnap quite consistently rejected the synthetic a priori, whereas Bolzano did not do so and allowed some logical truths to count as synthetic a priori.  For Morscher, this turns Bolzano into a "Super-Kant", rather than the anti-Kantian that he is often portrayed as, and so contradicts a supposedly unifying feature of Austrian tradition, the rejection of Kant's synthetic a priori.  The objection that, given Bolzano's and Kant's differences over analyticity, this way of putting matters may be as misleading as the view argued against, is not discussed.

Bolzano's political philosophy is discussed by Rolf George and Paul Rusnock.  Following some scene-setting remarks on the socio-historical situation in Bohemia, George and Rusnock concentrate on the social engagement of Bolzano's weekly exhortations (Erbauungsreden) to university students and the educated public in Prague (that led to his dismissal) and on his small book On the Best State.  (Since the authors do not do so, it may be added here that the latter is now available, together with some of the "Exhortations", in English translation in their edition of Bolzano's Selected Writings on Ethics and Politics (2007).)  In these writings Bolzano emerges as a pronouncedly progressive enlightenment thinker arguing, for instance, for the equality of women and against the adoption of a state religion, but always advising that his views to be subjected to the reader's critical scrutiny.  With some of the institutional arrangements recommended in On the Best State likely to strike present-day readers as either utopian or primitively socialist, George and Rusnock helpfully delineate the limiting conditions that informed Bolzano.  While not his "greatest legacy", as Bolzano thought himself, they conclude that On the Best State nonetheless "contributed materially to the development of a healthy, largely tolerant and democratic political culture in Bohemia", adding that in his time this was "something of an anomaly in Central Europe".

The topic of the final essay is Austrian aesthetics.  Maria E. Reicher discusses Bolzano's definition of beauty and his ontology of art, before turning to Meinong's theory of emotional presentation and its relevance for aesthetics, Witasek's theory of immanent aesthetic objects and Ehrenfels' defense of objectivism in aesthetics.  According to Bolzano, a beautiful object is one the "examination" of which "gives pleasure to all those persons whose cognitive faculties are properly developed".  The source of the pleasure is not the object itself, but its examination; beauty is but the disposition to give rise to such a pleasurable examination.  This is an objectivist account very unlike Kant's in that Bolzano deems it constrained what examinations are proper, even though they are said to proceed entirely intuitively.  Ontologically, Bolzano advocated what Reicher calls a "mentalist" conception: some works of art are mere complexes of thoughts (subjectively understood as ideas of the artist which a recipient has to recreate), though some also possess physical correlates.  How this sits with his implied objectivism is not entirely clear and Reicher finds this to be a problem also in the other Austrian contributions discussed.

With the survey of the essays concluded, I turn to the question of what precisely gives unity to their collection in this volume?  As is evident from my survey, there is no first-order thematic strand that connects them all.  Rather, what connects them is that they all treat of authors belonging to what the editor explicitly calls "Austrian Philosophy" and "the Austrian tradition".  Here it emerges that it would have been helpful to receive some guidance that is not forthcoming.  Textor notes that it is entirely legitimate to speak of "Analytic Philosophy" without possessing a definition, given that it is "a tradition held together by the use of a distinctive family of concepts, acceptance of specific assumptions, problems and methods for their solution".  One might think therefore that the same goes for Austrian Philosophy and, indeed, Textor says so.  Yet this he does in a footnote that also advertises the fact that "Wittgenstein is a philosopher from Austria but not an Austrian philosopher.  Brentano, by contrast, is from Germany, but is an Austrian philosopher" (his emphasis).  This raises the question why Wittgenstein is excluded by Textor.  (This question becomes even more pressing given that two of the contributors to this volume do discuss Wittgenstein, one explicitly as an Austrian philosopher.)  Since there are no indications that Wittgenstein is to be excluded from Analytic Philosophy, it would seem that talk of an Austrian tradition raises issues that talk of the analytic tradition does not.  (What, if anything, makes the Austrian tradition distinctive in Analytic Philosophy?)

Another way of probing the question of the identity of the Austrian tradition is to ask whether the use of the definite article in the title of this collection is justified.  Here it may be noted that it often is a measure of the acceptance of a thesis if its originator is no longer mentioned.  So perhaps Rudolf Haller ought to take it as a triumph that a book like the present one can appear without his name being mentioned, but matters are not so simple.  For, as noted, according to Haller, post-Bolzanian Austrian philosophy comprised two wings, the Brentano-school leading to Meinong's school in Graz, Twardowski's school of Polish logicians and Husserl's phenomenology, and the positivist Machian tradition leading to the Vienna Circle.  Since the present collection features no Mach and theorists from the Vienna Circle only twice, however, it would appear that the definite article in the title either signals implicit dissent from Haller's taxonomy or somewhat cavalierly addresses a perceived imbalance in recent Anglophone historiography of analytical philosophy.  (What, if anything, makes the Brentano-wing more Austrian than the positivist wing deriving from Mach?)

The editor may of course respond that -- his throw-away remark notwithstanding -- the issue of the identity of the Austrian tradition belongs to those questions that have been bracketed in the present collection.  (Another one apparently so bracketed concerns the issue of the relation of Bolzano's thought to the Brentano school, a topic surely of interest to the Bolzano scholar Textor.)  Such a response could not be faulted.  After all, the definite article in the title apart, no claims are here advanced to close off such further studies.  Instead, awareness of the need to look still closer at many of the aspects of the tradition of Austrian Philosophy that Haller, Smith and Dummett first drew attention to informs the contributors.  So to conclude, let me reiterate the richness and usefulness of this collection as it stands.  It shines very welcome light on important forbears of twentieth century analytic philosophy and either stresses continuities of interest and issues or much clarifies the relation of their philosophical views to more contemporary ones they are often said to "anticipate".


Bolzano, Bernard (2007), Selected Writings on Ethics and Politics (ed. by R. George and P. Rusnock), Rodopi, Amsterdam.

Carnap, Rudolf, Hans Hahn and Otto Neurath (1929), Wissenschaftliche Weltauffassung. Der Wiener Kreis, Vienna, trans. "The Scientific Conception of the World. The Vienna Circle", in Neurath, Empiricism and Sociology (ed. by M. Neurath and R.S. Cohen), Dordrecht: Reidel, 1973.

Dummett, Michael (1993), The Origins of Analytical Philosophy, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard.

Haller, Rudolf (1968), "Ludwig Wittgenstein und die österreichische Philosophie", repr. in Studien zur Österreichischen Philosophie, Amsterdam: Rodopi, 1979, trans. "Wittgenstein and Austrian Philosophy" in Haller, Questions on Wittgenstein, London: Routledge, 1988.

Haller, Rudolf (1986), Fragen zu Wittgenstein und Aufsätze zur österreichischen Philosophie, Amsterdam: Rodopi.

Nyiri, J. C., ed. (1981), Austrian Philosophy: Studies and Texts, Munich: Philosophia.

Nyiri, J. C., ed. (1986), From Bolzano to Wittgenstein: The Tradition of Austrian Philosophy, Vienna: Hölder-Pichler-Tempsky.

Smith, Barry (1994), Austrian Philosophy. The Legacy of Franz Brentano, Chicago: Open Court, 2nd ed. 1998.