The Autonomy of Morality

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Charles Larmore, The Autonomy of Morality, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 277pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521717823.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


Charles Larmore has long been recognized as a major figure in moral and political thought, his reputation having been secured by two volumes, Patterns of Moral Complexity (1987) and The Morals of Modernity (1996), remarkable for their development of the insights of disparate philosophical traditions. In The Autonomy of Morality, he has gathered together nine earlier essays published between 1999 and 2004 and added a lengthy, new chapter on the theme that gives the whole volume its focus and title. By "the autonomy of morality" he means to convey the idea that moral reasons do not depend for their authority on anything beyond themselves -- neither on the individual thinker, nor the moral community, nor other kinds of reasons. Morality "speaks for itself" (88) and "with its own voice" (8), as he often likes to put it.

Larmore embeds this idea in a framework that construes reasons as forming part of the furniture of the world, fully as real as minds and matter. He thus sets himself against the thesis, which he regards as one of the pillars of Kantian ethical thought, that morality is not "out there" but is the product of free, rational, co-deliberating agents. The principal hero of this collection, nonetheless, is the foremost Kantian moral philosopher of our time: John Rawls. But Larmore argues that what Rawls drew from Kant weakened or obscured the later thinker's chief insights. Rawls's deepest contribution to political philosophy, he suggests, is the idea of public reason, which rests on the unconstructed value of respect for all human beings, as well as the insight, available to modern thinkers but inaccessible to an earlier philosophical tradition, that free human beings cannot but differ profoundly about the good. Rawls's principal failing, Larmore thinks, is his turning away, under the influence of Kant, from the robust realism found in the "rational intuitionism" (as Rawls called it) of such figures as Clarke, Prichard, and Ross.

In his chapter, "History and Truth", Larmore accepts the thesis, central to Richard Rorty's philosophical outlook, that one's cognitive framework is always shaped by historical contingencies, but argues, against him, that "the world remains the object of our thinking" and that intellectual inquiry is a process in which we are "drawing closer to the truth" (25). In "Back to Kant? No Way," a discussion of Karl Ameriks' Kant and the Fate of Autonomy, he insists that Kant and the tradition he inspired go astray in failing to distinguish between being self-governing and being a self-legislator: a self-governing person is able to shape his desires and actions to reflect the independent order of reasons, whereas a self-legislator traces the authority of norms to their origin in human reason. Against Ameriks, Larmore holds that it is the ideal of self-governance, not the anti-realistic ideal of self-legislation, that constitutes Kant's real insight. The Kantian picture of reason as the originator of norms must be replaced by the image of reason as an essentially receptive faculty -- a capacity to heed what has independent validity. "Reason just is our responsiveness to reasons," as he later says (135).

"Attending to Reasons" is a critique of the Wittgensteinian quietism of John McDowell's Mind and World. Larmore applauds McDowell's emphasis on "second nature" as "the means by which the mind is responsive to reasons" (51) and endorses the thesis that reasons are (in McDowell's words) "there anyway" as possible objects of knowledge. Nonetheless, Larmore complains, McDowell has failed to acknowledge that his picture of the relation of mind to world is a metaphysical program riddled with its own peculiar philosophical quandaries. The chief problem he believes McDowell has evaded is how normative objects (reasons) can be a part of reality. They are, Larmore insists -- and here he agrees with the leading idea of J.L. Mackie's Inventing Right and Wrong -- peculiar entities, being offensive to the naturalism of the modern outlook, which posits matter and mind as all there is. When the mind grasps or responds to reasons, Larmore argues, a third part of reality -- the normative entities of the world -- are acting on it, as though there is a "natural sympathy or pre-established harmony" between the two (55). How reasons can be causes is a question Larmore finds himself unable to answer; his charge against McDowell is that he refuses to acknowledge this as a philosophical problem.

"John Rawls and Moral Philosophy," which derives from a review in The New Republic of Rawls's Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy, begins to rehearse the themes that occupy Larmore in later chapters. Rawls's constructivism, Larmore argues, rests on a deeper moral realism, and therefore has non-Kantian roots that Rawls did not properly appreciate. Modern political life, according to Larmore, must acknowledge, as Rawls insisted, the essential contestability of our deepest ideals. A liberal order is one in which we respond to the objective (and therefore unconstructed) value of treating each other in accordance with what Rawls called the "liberal principle of legitimacy," which requires the fundamental premises of civic reasoning to be accessible to the opposed perspectives of all reasonable citizens.

The title essay of the volume (and its longest) is placed next, and is framed as a defense of one of the principal themes of H.A. Prichard, namely, that moral reasons cannot be, and need not be, validated by anything external to themselves. To be a moral person, Larmore holds, is to see another's good as an unmediated and legitimate demand on oneself (73, 88). Therefore, any attempt to validate that demand through self-interest or rational freedom destroys its unmediated status. What is most provocative in this essay is its extended discussion of the failures of Hobbes, Kant, and their contemporary followers (chiefly David Gauthier and Christine Korsgaard), to appreciate Prichard's point that the question, "why be moral?" is ill-conceived. Kantians, according to Larmore, are of course not egoists, but they nonetheless make the same mistake as egoists: they seek to ground the authority of moral reasons on something beyond those reasons themselves.

The volume's remaining essays elaborate on many of the themes just summarized, and bring them to bear on the leading ideas of other philosophers whom Larmore greatly admires -- particularly Jürgen Habermas, Phillip Pettit, and Frederick Nietzsche. Finally, in the last essay of the volume, Larmore returns to Rawls, and offers one final critique of his moral philosophy: The theory of the good presented in A Theory of Justice, Larmore argues, must be rejected, because it rests on the assumption, widespread throughout the history of moral philosophy, that one ought to live one's life according to a plan. That assumption, Larmore argues, misses the fundamental point that many important goods take us by surprise, because they are made good by future facts that inevitably elude our ability to plan.

1. Reasons as a spooky third world

"What precisely is a reason, and how can there exist, independently of our beliefs about them, normative entities of this sort?" (51). Larmore's answer is that "reasons are essentially normative and resist identification with anything physical or psychological" (59). "The order of reasons," he says, is "a third ontological dimension of the world" (63).

That "reasons are essentially normative" is tautological, since we are talking about the sort of reason that lends support (pro tanto or decisive) to a conclusion about what someone ought to believe, desire, or do. But one might balk at Larmore's further point that reasons "resist identification with anything physical." After all, the power of a heated poker to burn you, which is certainly one of its physical features, is a reason why you ought to stay away from it. Similarly, the reasons for believing in modern geological theories are out there in the world, scattered throughout the earth's inner crusts.

Perhaps what Larmore means, then, is that being a reason is not a physical (or mental) relation. That is undoubtedly correct. But it is misleading or worse to say, as he does, that in addition to physical objects and minds, there is a third dimension of reality -- namely, reasons. Reasons are not weird individuals, exerting a ghostlike causal influence on those minds fortunate enough to have become attuned to them. Rather, certain physical and psychological features of our environment (the power of heated pokers to burn us, the suffering of our neighbors) bear the reason-relation to our intentions, beliefs, and desires. Those familiar features of reality constitute reasons for us to believe that we ought to behave in certain ways, and to form intentions to do so. Physical and psychological aspects of the world around us bear the reason-why-one-ought relationship to our minds.

If one finds it baffling that there should be other relations besides physical ones -- namely reasons -- then one ought to be baffled by much else besides. Logical entailment is not a physical relationship between sentences, for example. A sentence composed of chalk might weigh more than a similar sentence, composed of the very same words, made of ink; but the physical features of these inscriptions make no difference to the entailment relations borne by those sentences. Another example: oats and horses are physical entities, but the relation between them -- the goodness of oats for horses -- is an evaluative and not a physical relation. Being good for a living thing is not a mysterious third type of individual, alongside living things and the nourishment that is good for them. It is a relation between physical objects, though not a physical relationship like having greater mass or temperature.

2. Reason as responsiveness to reasons

Larmore asks: "how is it that reasons act on us, when we grasp or respond to them?" (65, n. 28). The answer he gives is that we have the faculty of reason, and "reason just is our responsiveness to reasons" (135). He shares McDowell's "conviction that in experience the world impresses itself upon us as the knowable world it is" (55). Reason does not somehow construct out of its own resources the reasons by which we guide ourselves; rather it is at the receiving end of the force exerted by something to which its historically rooted condition has gained it access. Larmore seems to envisage the mind as a waxlike entity upon which external objects make impressions: it does nothing when this happens except to open itself to the third world of reasons that causally impresses itself upon it.

But the thesis that "reason just is our responsiveness to reasons" is surely too simple, because it is not the case that the only power that a competent reasoning faculty can have is the passive power to recognize the cogency of a reason that has somehow come to its attention. We actively inquire into what reasons there are to believe this or that theory, or to undertake this or that course of action. We use reason to construct theories about the world, and some of these theories contain hypotheses about when certain features of the world provide us with reasons. When we respond to reasons -- e.g. when we take a person's visible suffering to give us reason to assist him -- we do so because our confrontation with our environment is guided by a theory, however fragmentary, about what we, as reason-guided beings, should pay attention to. Our receptivity to reasons, in other words, is not a wholly passive affair, but is the product of our active engagement in a process of learning about how we should shape our intentions, beliefs, and desires. Just as trained eyes in a museum know what to look for, and are not merely passively taking in the beauty of its paintings, so practical reason is not merely a receptive faculty, but is always playing an active role in shaping its own theory about which factors constitute reasons.

3. Morality "speaks with its own voice"

Larmore follows Prichard's famous essay "Does Moral Philosophy Rest on a Mistake?" in finding the question, "Why be moral?" ill-conceived, since it presupposes that moral reasons require validation from a source external to the moral point of view. We simply have to be receptive to moral reasons, because they by themselves lead to conclusions about what we ought to do, all things considered. Of course, Larmore concedes that over the course of a moral life one may find oneself asking whether one should make the sacrifices that are sometimes demanded by moral requirements. But if someone wonders, on a particular occasion, why he should pay the costs of being moral, the only possible answer to his difficulty is to rehearse once again the cogency of the reasons for doing what morality now requires of him. Philosophy cannot help him by providing some further grounding of moral considerations in something extrinsic to morality -- human freedom, or self-interest, for example. It can ask him to recognize that moral considerations already have, on their own, normative force. That, Larmore claims, is a point obscured or denied by the whole tradition of Kantian moral philosophy.

When Larmore affirms the autonomy of morality, he means that a principle of universal and impartial concern for the good of others has independent weight as a reason. "The moral point of view … consists in taking an interest in another's good that is as direct, as unmediated by ulterior considerations, as the interest we naturally take in our own" (89). This is a remarkably demanding conception of what morality requires of us, for Larmore makes it clear that the good of every other human being has as great a claim to my attention as my own does (89), and presumably he holds that my own good is properly a great concern of mine. To be fully moral, I must be as much a caretaker of every other member of the human race as I am of myself.

What of such commonsense moral requirements as keeping promises, paying debts, speaking truthfully, refraining from theft and adultery, and so on? Do these moral rules also have independent weight, or do they constitute reasons only to the extent that they help us secure the good of others? Are lies to be told, for example, if the good of others is best served by doing so? What if keeping a promise will do no one any good? Larmore does not address these questions, but his position is precarious. If he denies any independent weight to these principles, then, in a sense, he is denying that morality -- or, at any rate, a sizeable portion of commonsense morality -- "speaks with its own voice". On the other hand, if he gives a blanket endorsement to the whole panoply of commonsense moral rules, then he offers no critical purchase on the social norms that happen to be in place in one's society.

When Larmore speaks of the interest we are morally required to take in the good of "another," I take him to be speaking elliptically: it is the good of another human being that he has in mind, not the good of all living creatures whatsoever. But some explanation is needed of why morality calls for such partiality. After all, there is such a thing as the good of plants and animals. So, what justifies giving less care, or none, to their well-being? The answer favored by many Kantians is that human beings have a faculty that goes beyond mere receptivity; after all, animals and plants are receptive to the world in all sorts of marvelous ways, taking in its heat, light, and sounds, and making use of their environments in the light of the information their senses deliver. We rise above the rest of nature because we not only are receptive to the world but have the freedom to abide by laws of our own devising. Larmore cannot give that answer, of course. He must say, instead, that morality requires us to care for humanity (rather than many other living things) because human beings are receptive to reasons. But why does a creature's receptivity to reasons, not its receptivity to the many other features of the world, make so large a difference? In fact, one could plausibly argue that many animals are receptive to reasons: the intense heat the lion feels as it approaches the fire is a reason for it to reverse course, and its responsiveness to that cue is therefore a responsiveness to a reason. Of course, the lion does not have the concept of a reason, but neither do children.

Larmore says at one point, without elaboration, that "the claims of morality need not always be paramount" (89). If I understand this correctly, it means that moral principles give us pro tanto reasons, but that these can be overridden, at least in certain circumstances, by non-moral considerations that have greater weight. If morality speaks with its own voice, then so too do the claims of self-interest. One's own good does not have to be grounded in some other type of consideration, in order to give one reasons. Presumably the same could be said about the good of one's family, friends, fellow citizens, and so on. But this way of thinking would eviscerate Larmore's principle that the good of every human being has an equal claim to one's attention. Morality, he holds, requires that I see each person's good as giving me some reason -- and an equally weighty reason -- for action. But self-interest also gives me pro tanto reasons, as do my special relationships with the various social circles to which I belong; and when these further pro tanto reasons are added to the mix, there will be little, if anything, that I need do for other human beings simply in virtue of their humanity. Morality, as it is normally understood, cannot be one tiny voice among a vast throng. It ceases to be what it pretends to be, if it too easily gives way to competing considerations. One of the tasks of philosophical ethics overlooked by Prichard is to explain what, if anything, entitles morality to this special status. Larmore does not rise to this task.

Rawls rejects rational intuitionism because it has too thin a conception of personhood. Moore, for example, assumes that one can derive substantive guidance about practical matters simply by achieving conceptual clarity about the concept of goodness; one does not need, in addition, any insights about human nature or the problems of social organization. Similarly, Larmore thinks that reason, in favorable circumstances, is receptive to the fact that morality requires an equal concern for the good of all. But just as Rawls follows Hume in recognizing that justice gets its hold on us only because of moderate scarcity and other background conditions, so we should see that our general obligations to humanity make sense only because we live in a certain kind of social world. Human beings generally need the help of other members of their species, including people to whom they have no blood relations. They are often effective in perceiving the needs of others and in meeting them. They are capable of returning good for good, and are prone to retaliate for ill treatment. And so on.

It is easy to lose sight of these empirical facts and to suppose that moral reasons have their force in isolation from them. Therein lies the danger of such formulae as "morality speaks for itself". It would be better to say that when moral considerations have normative force, they do so because they are accompanied by many other sorts of considerations. Morality would have no grip on us if it were often contrary to the requirements of rationality, or if it incessantly and normally required extreme sacrifices in one's well-being, or if it typically led to outcomes that increased human misery or undermined our physical and psychological powers. Properly understood, it is of course not debilitated in any of these ways. On the contrary, the human race is generally better off because its members are capable of moral reasoning. But notice how distant this thought is from Larmore's idea that morality forms an autonomous realm of reasons that impress themselves upon minds lucky enough to receive them. For him, the fact that an act is morally required is all that we need know of it, in order to understand why there is a reason to perform it. We need not embed this fact in a larger empirical and evaluative network of facts. We need not ask whether it is true, as I just claimed, that we are generally better off because we can respond to moral considerations. Rawls was right to distance himself from this austerely narrow approach to moral philosophy. Larmore's failure to understand Rawls's reasons for rejecting rational intuitionism is a blind spot in his conception of ethics.

In a way, it is odd that Larmore should have painted himself into this corner, because he defines morality as something that has to do with goodness: "morality in general involves seeing another's good as a reason for action on my part" (88). Unfortunately, he does not put forward any views about how "another's good" is to be interpreted. Does morality always speak in favor of doing what is good for another person, that is, what benefits him? Does it not often speak precisely against such meddling with another person's life? Or is "another's good" to be interpreted more broadly, encompassing everything another person may do for which there is a reason? Do I owe it to my fellow human beings, simply by virtue of their being fellow human beings, to help them achieve whatever it is that they take to be good, however misguided they are? That hardly seems plausible. But it is no less implausible to suppose that what I owe to others is whatever it is that I take to be good. Perhaps, then, what we owe to another person is some attention to what really is the good of that person -- not what merely seems (to myself or to him) such. But that will be an empty requirement, unless it is combined with an account of what is good. Lacking such an account, Larmore's words -- "morality involves seeing another's good as a reason for action" -- convey nothing of substance. He is left only with the tautology that morality requires that we treat others as we ought.

One way to avoid the difficulties that beset Larmore's approach would be to look afresh at the possibility he dismisses, namely that one way to account for why certain reasons are reasons is to recognize how social institutions can themselves create reasons. Perhaps, in other words, normative reasons are not all of them "there anyway," that is, independent of human activity; perhaps some are products of human expectations and practices. Suppose, for example, we have a ground-level obligation to obey the valid legal rules of our community; in that case, what makes it the case that one citizen has a reason to treat another citizen in a certain way is that the law requires him to do so. Whether we do have an obligation to obey the law is of course a contestable question, but there is nothing incoherent in the idea that sometimes what makes it the case that someone has a reason is a social practice.

It would not follow that all reasons are in this way social creations. What is good for a human being is presumably fixed by facts that are independent of social institutions; but what is morally obligatory might, like what is legally required, be determined by features, explicit or implicit, in the prevailing norms that govern the individual upon whom the obligation falls. (You ought to keep that particular promise, for example, because, according to prevailing social norms, the act you performed constituted a bona fide promise, and no one would count your current circumstances as ones that release you from your obligation.) If that were so, the process by which we come to know what moral reasons we have would, in some cases at least, be akin to the process by which a competent judge learns how to interpret the law. Skill as a moral reasoner would be acquired through a complex combination of interpretive, imaginative, and deliberative social skills. That strikes me as a plausible picture of how we actually become moral knowers (when we manage to do so). It avoids the idea, which Larmore sees as the original sin of the Kantian tradition, that acts of sheer collective will, ungrounded in reasons external to the will, can by themselves bring moral reasons into existence. Reasons can be social products without being arbitrary posits.

4. Rawls

Larmore is unattracted by Rawls's use of the social contract tradition. "The contractarian idiom may have been a mistake, for the very idea of a contract appears redundant and obfuscating" (75). So, it is not the apparatus of the original position that inspires his allegiance to the Rawlsian framework, but the idea that in a legitimate state the most fundamental principles must be couched in terms that are transparent to the reason of all citizens, however deeply divided they are about moral and religious matters (as we can expect them to be when they live in conditions of freedom). The key point, for Larmore, is that the laws of the state have coercive force, and it is wrong to threaten people with punishment if the law they would be violating is one whose justification is inaccessible to their reason.

He infers that the fundamental framework of the state "must remain neutral with regard to the comprehensive ideals of the human good on which citizens naturally tend to disagree" (194). But there is a great difference between (a) saying that the state would lose its legitimacy were it to threaten citizens with punishment for not abiding by (for example) the tenets of Catholicism, and (b) saying that the constitution of a legitimate state cannot create institutions designed to persuade citizens of the truth of Catholic doctrine. Even if we accept (a), that is not by itself a reason to accept (b) as well. What reason is there, then, to accept the idea, which plays such an important role in Rawls's liberalism, that the basic terms of politics must not be drawn from this or that religious or moral tradition? If we are not skeptical about the ability of human reason to arrive at the truth about fundamental moral matters -- and neither Rawls nor Larmore expresses such skepticism, because that would undermine their own ideas -- then why should such truths not be taught by whichever institutions are most effective at teaching them? There are, of course, reasons to doubt whether the state can be a competent or effective teacher of religious truth. But whether governments are inevitably debilitated in this way is an empirical question. Rawls and Larmore think that even if the state could bring children to understand and accept religious (or ethical) truths, it should not do so. But Larmore is too close to Rawls's way of thinking to see that this is a question that is not well answered in Rawls's writings.

In addition to casting doubt on contractualism and Rawls's rejection of the realism of the moral intuitionists, Larmore objects to the particular theory of the good that is developed in Chapter VII of A Theory of Justice and then adapted, with modifications, in Political Liberalism. Curiously, He does not raise the obvious question that would arise for any Rawlsian political philosopher who accepted Larmore's critique of "goodness as rationality" (as Rawls labels his theory): if that is not the theory of goodness that should guide the fundamental assumptions of political discourse, then what is? Is there some better theory of goodness that should be used for political purposes? Or should political discourse not rest on any assumptions about goodness at all, as Rawls thought it should? There is no indication, in The Autonomy of Morality, about how these questions are to be addressed.

How persuasive is Larmore's critique of goodness as rationality? His main idea is that the whole of a person's good cannot be encompassed by a rational plan of life, because some goods are by their very nature surprising -- they happen to us unexpectedly. And it is even a second-order good that some first-order goods occur in this way, for "our lives would be the poorer if our happiness unfolded perfectly according to plan" (252). I agree. Parents, for example, should not want to know in every detail what their children will be like as they develop into adults. Part of the pleasure of raising children is being taken by surprise by them. Similarly, when we plan a visit to a city we have not seen before, we should take delight not only in what we expect to find, but also in whatever unpredictable attractions have personal meaning to us.

It is not obvious, however, that this point creates a serious difficulty for Rawls, because he does not claim that only the fulfillment of an actual plan is good; rather, what is good is the occurrence of what someone "would choose with deliberative rationality" (A Theory of Justice, 2nd edn., 366, my emphasis). When we are pleasantly surprised by what is unpredictable, we did not choose the events that occur, but even so, we would have chosen them. The concrete ways in which our children developed was not something we planned, but now that these events have transpired, we can say that we would have planned them, had we foreseen them and had the formation of a plan been needed to ensure their occurrence. We can be glad that not everything that is good actually needs our prior cognizance and preparation. Rawls's idea, however, is not that whatever is good needs prior preparation, but that whatever is good is something for which we ought to plan if planning is needed for its attainment.

5. Conclusion

Larmore's arguments need elaboration and a fuller defense, if the criticisms expressed here have some validity. Nonetheless, any reader of The Autonomy of Morality will recognize it as a fundamental contribution to moral and political philosophy. It tackles the deepest ethical questions with impressive originality and boldness; in political philosophy, it assesses, both negatively and positively, the basic ideas of the thinker who has done most among twentieth century writers to revive and enrich the field. Larmore's essays are remarkable not only for their boldness and depth, but for the elegance and precision with which they are written. This collection deserves and will no doubt reach a large audience.