The Bad Conscience

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Vladimir Jankélévitch, The Bad Conscience, Andrew Kelley (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 179pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226009537.

Reviewed by Nicolas de Warren, Husserl Archives, KU Leuven


An unsuspecting reader could be easily forgiven for initial misgivings with Andrew Kelley's decision to include in his English translation of Vladimir Jankélévitch's The Bad Conscience every addition and deletion introduced in two subsequent re-editions (in 1951 and 1966) since its first publication in 1933. At first glance, this decision seems to visually encumber a text that demands undivided attention. As with other works, Jankélévitch continually emended his re-editions, and although his retouches are largely unassuming, each edition offers in fact another image of a book that subtly remained in motion. Kelley's conscientious decision to collate and include variations across the three editions has the virtue of accentuating this intrinsic dynamic to Jankélévitch's thinking. The lissome prose of his meditations, supplely rendered in Kelley's accomplished translation, presents the reader with a philosophical experience unlike any other. His voice is unique among a generation of French philosophers who were each gifted writers and thinkers. Unlike others in the pantheon of 20th century French philosophy, Jankélévitch eschews grand gestures and revolutionary claims. Neither ponderous nor pedantic, the seriousness that infuses Jankélévitch's thought, and in particular The Bad Conscience (one must be mindful of the notorious year of its publication), unfolds along chromatic scales played with a lightness of touch both demanding and generous. There is something of the master performer and master teacher -- un maître à penser -- from whom there is much to learn, provided one is disposed with a saintly patience and open to an unfinished adventure.

This book is Jankélévitch's first original work of philosophy (even though his PhD thesis on Schelling, published in the same year, is far from a standard academic work). The first in a series of shorter books published until the outbreak of the Second World War, The Bad Conscience announces many of the themes and directions that would fully mature over the course of Jankélévitch's philosophical development. It is an indirect precursor to his 1967 Forgiveness (also finely translated by Andrew Kelley), with many of the arguments against "impure" forgiveness in the latter work already outlined in the former. In both works, questions of remorse, forgiveness, grace, and the "irrevocable" (a central concept in his peerless 1977 study La mort) are reflected upon in a mode of thought where the triumph of hope and joy over evil is not promised cheaply or effortlessly.

Jankélévitch is a challenging writer, as his prose is characterized by an almost complete absence of self-awareness. His writing does not have the form of an inner monologue (despite first appearances) nor does it address itself to a dialogical interlocutor. Jankélévitch's thinking hovers instead in a space of its own creation, suspended between the interiority of an authorial voice and the exteriority of a communicative act. As with a musical score (Jankélévitch was himself an adept musicologist and talented pianist), the entire argument is animated by a set of dominant motifs that appear, disappear, and reappear in different permutations.

The book is organized into three chapters followed by a postscript. The different "bars" or "measures" within each chapter, and the three chapters, are structured through a non-dialectical progression of paired oppositions (regret and remorse, the irreversible and the irrevocable, consolation and the inconsolable, etc.). In Chapter One, "The Semi-Conscience," Jankélévitch begins with two oppositions inscribed within the French word conscience. The French conscience supports two distinct meanings that English keeps separate in differentiating between consciousness and conscience. Depending on context and use, the French conscience can either mean "consciousness" or "conscience." In the first case, conscience ranges over meanings such as "awareness," "consciousness," and "self-awareness," whereas in the second case, conscience designates a moral sense of right and wrong, or a guilty conscience. Whereas consciousness is, of all things among human beings, the most equally distributed, conscience is arguably a rarer breed, and often endangered by consciousness itself. On Jankélévitch's understanding, consciousness is intrinsically self-aware and essentially a self-relation (both subject and object), while "conscience" -- the having of a bad conscience -- is fundamentally lacking in any self-awareness that might allow or promote the insinuation of a good conscience (self-satisfaction, self-complacency, etc.) in the having of a bad conscience. In a manner that anticipates Sartre's celebrated analyses of bad faith and sincerity in Being and Nothingness, consciousness, as the relation of consciousness to itself, is always liable to not shoulder the full responsibility ("conscience") for itself ("consciousness"): in being an object for itself, consciousness reflects upon itself as in a hall of mirrors that allows for consciousness to perpetually slip away from itself. In contrast, a bad conscience is without any distance towards itself, or, in the terminology of German Idealism, it is a wounding self-affection (or in Bergsonian terms, a wounding intuition) without escape.

The next opposition follows closely from the first: if having a bad conscience provokes a crisis in being-conscious, this suggests for Jankélévitch that a bad conscience is a metaphysical experience that breaks with consciousness in any psychological sense, even as he insists on its concreteness as an experience. The most human disposition is towards oneself: to mind oneself to such a degree, and with such a conviction, that we do not admit of our wrongs; and even when we do, we admit them only to the degree we still allow ourselves to sleep. To be truly stricken with a bad conscience would be for the mindfulness of our consciousness to be so severely wounded by a "sacred horror" that we could neither sleep nor remain comfortably mindful of ourselves. It would be to awaken to metaphysics itself.

Having thus separated conscience from consciousness, Jankélévitch sketches a critique of three types of morality (eudaimonism, hedonism and utilitarianism) and, in a breathtaking flight of pages, argues for an underlying connection between consciousness, intellectualism (the standpoint of reason), and the unquestioned value of pleasure in conventional types of morality. Each rests on a good conscience and the optimism of reason. As Jankélévitch observes: "Reason, alas!, only teaches us to keep up appearances among the sadness of the world.  . . . Reason excels in consolations and its optimism encourages us to maintain a good mood, even though . . . But we know that there is no reason to rejoice" (9). "Sadness of the world" here signals the turn towards Jankélévitch's tragic wisdom and the genuine problem of ethics: how to live with the inconsolable pain of a bad conscience.

The remaining discussion in Chapter One reflects on the pure experience of pain, or suffering, that characterizes the ethical and metaphysical significance of a bad conscience. A genuinely moral consciousness (as opposed to conventional morality) is identical with the "true metaphysical problem: is there a consciousness without any distance?" (23). In a deft turn of argument, Jankélévitch rejects Nietzsche's genealogy of bad conscience as well as any positive notion of a voice of conscience that relies on the metaphor of a tribunal or the internalized impartiality of the moral spectator. A bad conscience is neither a voice nor a judging spectator, but a (self-inflicted) wounding. It is also not a form of self-knowledge, or inner objectification. The images of "spectator" or "tribunal" imply that conscience does not suffer the action it sanctions; it judges from the outside -- a voice coming from above. Genuine moral conscience is both living within the action (remorse) and viewing it from the outside in shame. A bad conscience is the metaphysical ipseity of Hell: it is a "dreadful solitude," a "moral agoraphobia" and the "panicked horror in feeling exposed in the presence of the only witness from whom it cannot hide anything, since this witness is myself" (27). As Jankélévitch rounds off these reflections: is conscience not the death of hope?

Chapter Two, "Irreversibility," the longest of the three chapters, is a philosophical tour de force organized as a progression through linked pairs of oppositions: regret vs. remorse; legal punishment, or justice, vs. the sanction of remorse; the irreversible vs. the irrevocable; the consolable vs. the inconsolable; repenting vs. remorse. Astute psychological observations, a host of literary and philosophical references, and insights of metaphysical salience texture Jankélévitch's reflections, thus preventing any facile (and false) reductionism of the experiences under discussion to any single form: psychological, ethical, or metaphysical. In fact, all three forms are modulated together. Within this polyphony, Jankélévitch sets forth his principal thesis that moral conscience (i.e., the suffering or bad conscience) is neither a "content" nor "form" of consciousness. Strictly speaking, "moral conscience does not exist" (35). It befalls us as the crisis of consciousness. In this visceral way, it cannot be fully identified with any determinate pain or particular moral crisis: it is, in other words, an "insuperable disgust" that passes through us and, in its wake, dispossesses us of our good conscience/consciousness (the double-entendre of the French conscience is here crucial) and self-complacency. Above all, it is marked as an inconsolable remorse in contrast to regret. As Jankélévitch writes: "The sorrow of regret is simply in the impossibility of a return to the past: time alone is guilty, but not me. What is tragic in remorse resides in the fact that I myself am the artisan of this impossibility" (43). The impossibility in question is the impossibility of undoing the wrong that I have done. The past wrong continues to abide in me; or rather, I continue to abide in the wrong that, in committing, I made possible, but which, now done, remains impossible for me to undo. Bad conscience is in this sense a conscience haunted by its own impotence to undo what it itself uniquely has done.

With this distinction between regret and remorse, Jankélévitch builds into his reflections the further distinction between irreversibility and the irrevocable as contrasting forms of sadness. Whereas death is the tragic element of the irreversible, the Hell of the irrevocable is "the eternal despair of the one who dies of not being able to die" (55). This emphasis on sadness reveals the profundity of the remorse of bad conscience and the sense in which Jankélévitch ascribes to sadness a fundamental ethical significance. This distinction(s) between the irreversible (regret) and the irrevocable (remorse) leads to the central problem of ethics: the inconsolable sadness at not being able to undo what has been done. It is not the regret that I could have done otherwise, but the horror that I can not undo who I have become in having had done what I once did.

For Jankélévitch, "three quarters of religion and of paranetic morality have consolation as their object, that is, compensation for what cannot be compensated" (66), but rather than pursue an ethics of consolation, he searches after an ethics for the inconsolable. In a set of reflections that anticipate directly aspects of Forgiveness, Jankélévitch speaks of time, reason, and belief in immortality as great consolers and identifies what he calls "two consolatory systems": Stoicism and its "conceptualization" and "banalization" of moral suffering, and the Christian ideal of compensation. Indeed, any form of religious consolation and salvation transforms the "meta-empirical Adieu that implies separation for always and forever, and consequently despair . . . into an empirical Goodbye." One is here struck by the originality of this introduction of the theme of Adieu into French ethical thought. Equally original in these critical reflections is the pitch of Jankélévitch's arguments against forgiveness as a therapeutic of the soul as well as any ethics of repenting as edifying, finalistic, or teleologically confident. As Jankélévitch closes his meditations in this chapter: "We were able to do all, and we have debased everything: how will this folly of ours ever be forgiven? When will we learn to say Amen?" (108).

In Chapter Three, "The Pacified Conscience," we look and move towards the postscript, "On Joy," from a moral abyss, or Hell. Although Jankélévitch speaks of the acute remorse of bad conscience as "despair," "suffering," and "anguish" (with clear echoes of Kierkegaard and Lev Shestov), it is the profound experience of inconsolable sadness that marks the veritable depth of Jankélévitch's metaphysical prayer. What philosophical reflection addresses is an inconsolable sadness in a universe ethically damaged by human agency, but where the force of this irrevocable damage de-centers, as it were, human freedom from itself. Bad conscience is stricken with a wound it cannot heal, and what amplifies its suffering is that it gives witness to a sadness of the world. In a fine turn of phrase, borrowed from Schelling (whose Philosophical Investigations into the Essence Human Freedom shadows The Bad Conscience), Jankélévitch speaks of the misadventure of the Sorcerer's Apprentice: "Man . . . is master of his action in terms of the doing of it, but not in terms of the undoing of it; the semi-sorcerer of semi-magic, the master of the action to be done becomes the servant of the action already done" (102).

What is to be done if we cannot undo what has been done? In other words:

Here then is what we would like to know: between the forgetting that is immoral and the reparation that is impossible, between these two opposite solutions, both of which volatize the problem instead of resolving it, does there not exist a third one that brings it close at hand instead of dodging it? Is the bad conscience efficacious? Is the bad conscience virtuous? (110)

Jankélévitch turns again to Schelling in proposing that the sadness of remorse born from the evil misdeed is nonetheless beneficial and healing: "evil is in itself its own medication" (120). Three stages in this Odyssey of the soul back to itself, to the living, are outlined: Remorse, Repenting, and Penitence. Rather than consider remorse as "buying back" evil, it functions as a witness to the solitude of the sin that fractures its solidity and immobility from the inside. The pain of sadness, as Jankélévitch eloquently writes, "mortally wounds the misdeed," and this grace of the wounding of evil is gratuitous and unmerited. It does not heal in the sense of forgetting or consolation. Rather, as Jankélévitch notes: "It is now up to us not to sleep" (127). Repenting opens onto penitence and the liberation of bad conscience through a dialogue with the Thou, the second person of love (131). The voice of the other commands: "stand up and walk." With this turn towards the Other, the absolute solitude of Hell is broken, and transformation, or metanoia, a new birth, is begun. The rebirth of consciousness does not abandon conscience, but this conscience is now intoxicated and elevated in Joy. In this manner, the redeemed conscience "simultaneously [goes] beyond the grotesque solicitude for oneself of the good conscience and the state of being torn or of interior warfare of the bad one," such that, in yet another elegant formulation, "the man healed by this medicine of remorse becomes again a friend to himself" (166). A fissure within the depths of remorse has opened through which the slanting light of joy shines: "and not only can the world no longer rob us of this joy, but the world itself sings" (173).