The Barbarian Principle: Merleau-Ponty, Schelling, and the Question of Nature

Placeholder book cover

Jason M. Wirth with Patrick Burke (eds.), The Barbarian Principle: Merleau-Ponty, Schelling, and the Question of Nature, SUNY Press, 2013, 352pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438448473.

Reviewed by Dale E. Snow, Loyola University Maryland


Jason Wirth describes this book as a collection of essays about the question of nature rather than an effort "merely to rehearse Merleau-Ponty's greatness or to again announce Schelling's relevance" (15). So although the book largely consists of papers originally presented at a conference in 2005 on the seemingly narrowly defined topic of Merleau-Ponty's appropriation of Schelling in his late lectures at the Collège de France, its scope is anything but narrow. Indeed, it is "an attempt to open up a three-way dialogue among the reader, Merleau-Ponty, and Schelling around the question of Nature against the at least implicit background of the Earth crisis" (16). Not just the introduction, but several other essays make reference to the parlous state in which we earth-dwellers find ourselves at present. Therefore, the potential audience for this book could be vast: everyone who is interested in the human estrangement from nature, its causes, and its cures. However, it quickly becomes clear that the intended audience is quite a bit smaller, given the philosophical sophistication and prior knowledge assumed by virtually all the contributors.

Still, "the question of Nature" is a pressing and vitally important one. How successful are these essays at rising to the bold challenge of helping the reader to rethink this question? The book consists of three sections: the first contains two introductory essays, one by each of the editors, valuable for orienting the reader in the admittedly daunting landscape of Schelling's Naturphilosophie, as well as introducing the fundamental rethinking of ontology Merleau-Ponty was engaged in during the last years of his life as he was writing what would become The Visible and the Invisible. The second section contains four essays on Schelling and the question of nature. The third and longest section, "Merleau-Ponty and Schelling in Conversation," has ten essays.

In terms of the task of wrestling with the central question of Nature, Wirth's introductory essay, as well as those of Robert Vallier, Josep Maria Bech, and Carolyn Culbertson should all be noted for their efforts to synthesize and contextualize the overarching philosophical concerns. Vallier's "Être sauvage and the Barbarian Principle: Merleau-Ponty's Reading of Schelling" forms a kind of fulcrum for the book: it is a revised version of one of the first important articles on Merleau-Ponty's encounter with Schelling, and it is a point of reference for several of the other essays. It also comments on the partiality and fragmentary nature of one of the most important text sources for these ideas, Nature: Course Notes from the Collège de France. Vallier finds Schelling's significance for Merleau-Ponty to lie in his radical interrogation of Cartesian ontology, which forces the phenomenologist to confront "the ultimate task" of "understand[ing] phenomenology's relation with non-phenomenology - - that is, with what does not belong to the philosophy of consciousness, with what is not constituted by consciousness" (121-22). That which is not constituted by consciousness is Schelling's "barbarian principle:" the unruly, destructive, unpredictable ceaseless productivity of nature, which he first described in the Naturphilosophie and further developed the implications of in the Freedom essay and The Ages of the World. It is the most compelling description of the problem phenomenology must confront: how to think the world of nature in which we find ourselves. Thus, for Vallier, one could argue that Schelling had already begun phenomenology's last task before Merleau-Ponty arrived at his own awareness of the urgency of this question by another route.

How is this last task of phenomenology to be accomplished? It is both delicate and difficult to write clearly about the limits of understanding, or how we may come to have a grasp of that which is not constituted by consciousness, the Unvordenklich (Schelling), or au premier jour (Merleau-Ponty). Vallier and Bech are both successful in mapping the territory: Vallier explains what is at stake for Merleau-Ponty as his understanding of the limitations of phenomenology changes. Bech elegantly lays out the structure of what he calls "shallow" and "deep" changes in Merleau-Ponty's thinking on nature as reflected in seven main conceptions, which he compares to the many axes of a multi-dimensional space (156). He also identifies twelve "points of diffraction" that arose out of the "epiphanic realignment" (168) produced by the confrontation with Schelling's Naturphilosophie. These are well-written, suggestive, and do not attempt to shoehorn the fragmentary, incomplete, and partially internally contradictory evidence into a single narrative or form. It is an accomplishment to hold complexity and difference up to the light so engagingly.

Bernard Flynn's "Nature's Inside" ought also to be mentioned for its usefully detailed account of the Cartesian background of the modern concept of nature; it could be read as the pre-history of the developments discussed by Bech and Vallier.

The genesis of the growing conviction that Merleau-Ponty saw himself driven to explore the idea of the possibility of a "phenomenology of pre-reflective being" has been given. Another subset of essays takes up this topic of what form such a phenomenology might take; three in particular explore it with reference to a return to a more ancient sense of nature. Kyriaki Goudeli and Jessica Wiskus focus on Schelling's reading of Plato's Timaeus, and Vasiliki Tsakiri on Schelling's idea of the eternal past. Angelica Nuzzo's "Finding the Body's Place in Nature" provides the clearest and most complete discussion of Merleau-Ponty's understanding of the body as that which is "always already there" as an "excess of Being over the consciousness of Being" (214) and how this relates to Schelling's conception of nature as pre-reflective being.

Art was of the highest philosophical significance for both Schelling and Merleau-Ponty, and there are three excellent essays devoted to this topic. Wiskus offers an intriguing meditation on the power of music to evoke that which cannot be directly presented by analyzing the philosophical significance of listening as emblematic of overcoming the passive-active duality. Marcia Sá Cavalcante Schuback employs Schelling's famous address "On the Relation of the Plastic Arts to Nature" (1807) and Merleau-Ponty's observations about painting to indicate that art may be the most direct path to that elusive goal, a phenomenology of pre-reflective being, or as Merleau-Ponty says, "Painting gives what Nature wants to say but does not say" (309). Wirth uses Schelling's diagnosis of the characteristic Geisteskrankheit of modernity, reflection and abstraction to explain the origin and the persistence of "the madness of thinking the Earth as an environment, as if we were the measure and reference point for Nature" (329). He concludes with some suggestive observations on the salvific function of art in Schelling, Schopenhauer and Nietzsche, comcerning, in particular, the possibility of reconciling the will that creates with the will that is the movement of nature itself.

Finally, there are three essays, all fine pieces of scholarship, that seem more tenuously related to the book's avowed topic. Joseph Lawrence's "Unfolding the Hidden Logos" strikes out in a direction he cheerfully admits to be unusual for contemporary Schelling scholarship: the question of the un-ground. This takes him on a journey to "the very bottom of Schelling's thinking" (56), which seeks to unveil the deeper logic of the relation of ground to unground, which also sheds light on the unexpectedly close resemblance of Schelling's concept of nature to the worldview of modern physics. Jeffrey Bernstein's "On the Relation Between Nature and History in Schelling's Freedom Essay and Spinoza's Theologico-Political Treatise" is just that: a close, careful reading of these two texts and largely devoted to the explication of internal tensions in Spinoza's concept of history. Stephen Watson's "Reading the Barbarous Source," despite the title, is in large part a reconstruction of Merleau-Ponty's journey away from his classical phenomenological roots in conversation with Husserl, Sartre, Martial Gueroult and others. He certainly makes the case that this is "a complex structure -- - and a complicated history" (262) but touches only at the beginning and end on the central concerns of the other writers.

As alluded to above, these are topics which stretch the limits of language by their nature (pun intended). Therefore, especially to be praised are those essays that eschew the phenomenological jargon that clutters and obfuscates to some degree in others. Admirable in this respect is Culbertson's "Nature and Self-Knowledge," which illuminates several of Schelling's concerns with imaginative, almost poetic discussions of Augustine and Dante. Wiskus, in "Listening for the Voice of the Light," performs a similar miracle in her use of Plato and Proust to gracefully evoke the dimensions of the questions with which Merleau-Ponty wrestled. She also manages to persuade the reader of their importance. Although Annette Hilt does not completely shy away from the phenomenological vocabulary, she uses it sparingly and judiciously in nuanced explanations of the relationship between human freedom and openness to Nature, which are exemplary in their clarity. This makes her essay the single most successful attempt to answer this book's central question.

There are a surprising number of proof-reading errors, and the index is oddly incomplete. For example, there is no index citation for F. H. Jacobi, despite lengthy quotations from him and references to the Pantheism Controversy. The terms 'environment,' 'prime matter,' and 'erste Natur' play important roles in more than one essay yet do not appear in the index; Unvordenklich(keit) appears in the text more frequently than the two instances listed. On the other hand references to specific works are very detailed, and there is a helpful index of Greek terms.

It should be obvious even from these brief observations that this is a big book on a big topic, and true to its stated inspiration it can be said to range far and wide in its treatment of vitally important questions. It would be of interest to students of both Merleau-Ponty and Schelling for the clash of titans aspect: it is fascinating to see how thinkers from such different starting-points and traditions end up standing so close to one another on these fundamental questions, and thought-provoking, too, to see where unresolvable differences remain. In addition to its central focus on the question of nature in the thought of Schelling and Merleau-Ponty, it contains provocative scholarship on Descartes, Spinoza, Kant, Hegel, the history of phenomenology, the philosophical significance of embodiment, and the fruitful and tantalizing relation between philosophy and art. The extent to which it succeeds in beginning a dialogue between the reader, Merleau-Ponty, and Schelling is a question each reader will have to answer, in freedom, herself.