The Basic Minimum: A Welfarist Approach

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Dale Dorsey, The Basic Minimum: A Welfarist Approach, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 217pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107017115.

Reviewed by Krista Thomason, Swarthmore College


Imagine two neighboring communities: one faring well with access to resources and one faring poorly, struck by famine. The society that these communities share has the opportunity to help one or the other, but not both. Which one should it help? The answer seems clear: it ought to help the group that is worse off. But why exactly is the answer so obvious? Dale Dorsey's aim in this book is to provide an account of the moral importance of the basic minimum: on what moral grounds do we claim that we ought to provide subsistence to those who do not have it (p. xiii)?

Dorsey begins with the premise that any view committed to the moral importance of the basic minimum must be committed to the idea that some state of persons is morally valuable: "I conclude that a view is committed to the basic minimum only insofar as this view is committed to the (at least) weak moral priority of a valuable absolute state of persons" (1-2). He seeks to specifically contrast a welfarist conception of the basic minimum with other, and as he argues, less plausible contenders. There are five other possibilities: primary goods and resources, human subsistence, social needs, basic human needs, and capabilities (8). Dorsey argues that each of these views is problematic in ways that the welfarist approach is not. As an example, suppose that the basic minimum is a list of goods that everyone ought to have. Once we specify which goods those are, we will immediately face a question of particularity: some people will need some goods and others will not (10). In order to properly distribute goods, we must then determine what purpose the goods serve, which will require knowing what sorts of lives people will lead. Dorsey concludes, then, that the goods themselves are not valuable, but rather the goods are valuable only as a means to some other state and it is that state that is of moral importance (19). If his critiques are correct, then the valuable state of persons is what explains the moral value of the basic minimum.

Dorsey argues that the most plausible account of the moral value of the basic minimum would explain it in terms of the promotion of individual welfare. In order to defend a welfarist account, he believes he must avoid what he calls "the welfarist dilemma" (33). A welfarist approach that takes seriously an individual's own preferences about the quality of her life must preclude the possibility of adaptive preference, or the possibility that a person's preferences change depending on her situation (33). But, if the welfarist approach should reject an individual's own preferences about her quality of life, such a view may advocate forcing individuals to live lives they do not value (33). Dorsey attempts to defend an account of a welfarist basic minimum that avoids these pitfalls.

He addresses the second horn of the dilemma by arguing for welfare as a "valued global project," where such a project is a long-term goal that both unifies an agent's life trajectory and makes life meaningful to the agent (39-41). If the basic minimum is the achievement of such a project, then no one will be forced to live a life she does not value: the project is one of her own choosing and one that she finds meaningful (55). To address the first horn of the dilemma, Dorsey amends his welfarist conception of the valued global project to include what he calls "preference coherentism" (89). Preference coherentism allows us to discover not just what an individuals preferences are, but what her preferences are "rendered coherent and complete" (89). He argues that we can uncover when an individual has adapted her preferences if we subject her conception of a good life to the proper kind of counterfactual reflection (93). Thus, an agent's real preferences will emerge once her conception of the good is determined to be both coherent and complete (94). According to Dorsey, this account of the welfarist basic minimum both survives the welfarist dilemma and provides a proper account of the moral importance of the basic minimum. If agents with valued global projects live good lives, then living a good life is a valuable state of persons (148). Thus we have moral reason to provide the basic minimum because it is simply good to promote good states of persons (148).

Dorsey's work is important because it tries to give form to some of our most basic moral intuitions. His arguments offer excellent starting points for further discussion, but I am skeptical that he succeeds in providing the right account for the apparent moral obviousness of the basic minimum. He offers his account as one that can operate equally well in the moral and political realms. He claims that we would have moral reason help those in need "whether or not political institutions should do so as well, or whether political institutions exist at all" (xiv). In light of this commitment, Dorsey speaks of moral reasons without specifying to whom those reasons apply. For example, he states that "there is a moral reason to promote intrinsic impersonal value" (148-149). Claims like these reveal a presumption on which much of his discussion rests: the basic minimum is a moral good to be promoted by, individuals, groups, and political institutions alike. For Dorsey, promoting the basic minimum is morally compelling for the same reason promoting the good more generally is morally compelling (149). The primary problem I see with his account is that by subsuming the basic minimum under the more general promotion of the good it fails to maintain a distinction between two conceptions of justice that some of his critics will see as essential to any understanding of the basic minimum. As such, the welfarist account he offers will not be compelling to opponents who conceive of justice as something other than promotion of the good.

When we claim that a just society ought to provide the basic minimum, that claim could be (what I will call) either substantive or systematic. The substantive claim is that society ought to help people in need -- perhaps for the same reason individuals should help others in need. This claim is, I take it, the one Dorsey is most concerned with. The systematic claim is that society's own policies ought not to create conditions that cause people to be in dire need. The second claim is slightly different than the first. In this case, providing the basic minimum is an obligation of justice, not only morality. It is a claim about the internal requirements for the structure of a just society. If institutions fail in this regard, we claim that they are unjust as institutions, not simply because of what they fail to do.

Of course, substantive justice and systematic justice are related. When, for example, the U.S. government acted slowly in response to Hurricane Katrina, it was a failure of justice in a substantive sense because society failed to help members who were in dire need. But it was also a failure in the systematic sense because the government was negligently unprepared to help the victims and mismanaged the aftermath. In this sense, systematic injustice can lead to substantive injustice. Substantive injustice, however, need not be the result of systematic injustice. Societies can be systematically just and tragedy may still befall them. In times of large-scale tragedy, even a systematically just society may not be able to provide for all of its members. Systematic justice can (though not always) provide substantive justice: if a society is structured to be prepared for emergencies, it can adequately help people in need.

Dorsey collapses the systematic claim into the substantive claim because he believes the systematic claim is untenable. He tries to show this with what he calls the problem of the guarantee: "Guarantee claims that political institutions . . . have an overriding moral reason to establish the basic minimum for all" (110-111, emphasis original). On this view, a society that fails to provide the basic minimum for everyone would be unjust. Dorsey responds to Guarantee with an example: a tsunami destroys the homes of six people, but society can only help five. He claims that helping the five would be just and that Guarantee's requirements are too strict (113). The welfarist approach does not subscribe to Guarantee because it only requires that the basic minimum be promoted when possible rather than required (148). On the welfarist account, all there is to the claim that society should help people in need is that society should provide the welfarist basic minimum. As long as society can provide the welfarist basic minimum, for Dorsey, it meets the substantive requirement of justice (148).

The trouble is that because Dorsey subsumes the basic minimum under the promotion of the good, on his view a society could be both systemically and substantively unjust while still providing the welfarist basic minimum. Recall that for him, the basic minimum requires that individuals have a valued global project that gives their lives meaning (39-41). Imagine a society where 90% of the population lives in poverty. It so happens that the 90% are also deeply religious and they believe that living in poverty is a religious virtue. As such, they never protest their poverty despite rampant health problems, minimal sustenance, and a high mortality rate -- indeed they welcome their poverty as an opportunity to live a religiously virtuous life. The 10% who govern the society happily exploit this fact and so siphon any funds that could go to alleviating the poverty to pay for their own valued projects. In this society, people in dire need go unaided and the social structures allow these conditions to persist. Provided that we could show that the 90% have not succumbed to adaptive preference, according to Dorsey everyone in this society would meet the basic minimum.

Dorsey can accept this society because on his account a just society is one that promotes the basic minimum (148). For those who think the basic minimum must bear some relation to the requirements of substantive or systematic justice, such a society is failing to provide the basic minimum. For these opponents, even if a society is set up in such a way that all its members live a meaningful life that they value, it does not properly capture what we mean by the basic minimum. Of course, it would be up to these opponents to show why this claim is convincing. The trouble is that Dorsey's welfarist approach has nothing to tempt his opponents toward his conclusion. His account is most compelling to those who already accept its underlying presumptions about the impersonal nature of moral reasons. For those who think that providing the basic minimum is ultimately about promoting the good, the welfarist account that he gives will be attractive. Dorsey may find this conclusion satisfactory, although it does not accomplish the aim he sets for himself in the beginning of the book. He seeks to explain the foundations for the moral weight of the basic minimum and so explain why we find it so compelling (1). In the end, he captures only a subset of those intuitions. Dorsey should be commended for wading into difficult and complex philosophical territory, but his welfarist account will not convert those who think the basic minimum is relevant to the structure of a just society, regardless of whether it promotes the good.