The Beast and the Sovereign, Volume 1

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Jacques Derrida, The Beast and the Sovereign, Volume 1, Geoffrey Bennington (tr.), U. of Chicago Press, 2009, 349pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226144283.

Reviewed by David Wills, SUNY-Albany



This is the inaugural volume of the proposed complete transcription of seminars taught by Derrida from 1959-2003, being published by Editions Galilée in French and the University of Chicago Press in English translation (the editors have helpfully provided page references to the Galilée edition in the margins of the Chicago volume). The Beast and the Sovereign, Volume 1 is the first part (2001-02) of a two-year series on the topic announced by the title, the second of which (from 2002-03, the last year Derrida gave his Paris seminar) is currently being translated. Volume I contains 13 sessions held from December 12, 2001 to March 27, 2002. The seminars will initially be published topic by topic in reverse chronological order. For the complete scope of the project see the Foreword and General Introduction; details regarding American editions are available at, website of the Derrida Seminars Translation Project (in which, I should disclose, I am a participant).

One could approach from various angles the gambit, and gamut, of Derrida’s project in The Beast and the Sovereign. The question of sovereignty is an explicit concern of Politics of Friendship (1997) and Rogues (2004), and in the index of the seminars it can be traced back as far as 1984. From Rogues, especially, we know that sovereignty is for Derrida part of the larger question he calls “ipseity,” the possibility of selfhood, which, for the ten-year period 1991-2001, was posed under the heading “Questions of Responsibility.” A formal or textual origin for that question is identified in Benveniste’s etymology, which relates the ipse to the exercise of power: "The sovereign, in the broadest sense of the term, is he who has the right and strength to be and be recognized as himself, the same, properly the same as himself" (66).

The explicit focus of the 2001-2003 classes, as reinforced by the posthumous publication of The Animal That Therefore I Am (2008), which dates from the 1997 Cerisy conference and one of whose chapters (on Lacan) is inserted into Session 4, is the animal. But, I would hasten to add, Derrida’s treatment of the topic exceeds the perspectives generally represented by movements for or toward animal rights or animal studies, and develops a more radical critique of speciesism involving the status of what lives [le vivant]. Thus the work exposed in The Beast and the Sovereign can also be related back to the seminars on “La Vie la Mort [Life/Death]” of the 1974-75 academic year, which Derrida footnoted on more than one occasion, and which he seemed to have been wanting to rework for some time.

The book’s self-presentation is formulated on a number of occasions throughout the seminars, so that the broad-reaching nature of Derrida’s problematic is clear: “The choice of the title for this seminar … was designed in the first place to keep bringing us back … to the immense question of the living” (176), where “the living” is a matter not of “those who live” but literally "that which lives [le vivant]." Or, in another formulation:

As those who have been following this seminar for a few years know well, through what we have tried to think together under the title of forgiveness, pardon, the death penalty, and sovereignty, what we were attached to was always … to try to think the living in life (219).

For example, that goes as far as asking — especially given the regularity with which mechanical animals are brought on stage whenever thinkers or writers evoke distinctions between the human and other species — what the living in life of a marionette is; as far as assuming the consequences of the fact that “one must … inscribe death in the concept of life” (110).

Another angle from which to approach the analyses Derrida undertakes here, also made explicit more than once, is that of the systematic — call it “classical” — deconstructive critique of false oppositions that we associate with his work from its beginnings. The distinctions on the basis of which the human species is separated from other animal species, properties that the human is supposed to possess whereas animals don’t, are all called into question by Derrida. And he extends most provocatively, to the point of calling it “necessarily indefinite” (130), the list of those distinguishing characteristics: language, speech, reason, response, logos, the sense of death, technique, history, convention, culture, laughter, tears, work, mourning, burial, institutions, clothing, lying, pretence of pretence, covering of tracks, the gift, respect (167, 130). However, to call those supposed or professed differences into question is by no means to say that there are no distinctions to be made, no differences between a human and an equine or canine or Cetacean animal, or between a protozoon and an amoeba. Instead, such a questioning calls upon thinkers to recognize new, more operative, better founded differences, to begin with by taking into account extraordinary advances in ethological research, but beyond that, by having thinking itself probe further into its own generic and specific reaches:

As always, to stick to the schema of my recurrent and deconstructive objections to this whole traditional discourse on ‘the animal’ (as though any such thing could exist in the general singular), one must not be content to mark the fact that what is attributed as ‘proper to man’ also belongs to other living beings if you look more closely, but also, conversely, that what is attributed as proper to man does not belong to him in all purity and all rigor; and that one must therefore restructure the whole problematic (56, my italics).

The importance, and “generalizability” of this basic principle cannot be emphasized enough, since it is something that many of Derrida’s detractors seem to refuse to understand. Before we come to deal with the large apparatus of erudition through which discourses on the animal are here analyzed, there is this one, rather straightforward lesson that we should take away from his classes:

The only rule that for the moment I believe we should give ourselves in this seminar is no more to rely on commonly accredited oppositional limits … than to muddle everything and rush, by analogism, toward resemblances and identities. Every time one puts an oppositional limit in question, far from concluding that there is identity, we must on the contrary multiply attention to differences, refine the analysis in a restructured field (16-17).

The Beast and the Sovereign also publicizes, for those who were not fortunate enough to hear Derrida teach in Paris, Irvine, or elsewhere, the extent of his engagement in the pedagogical enterprise. At the simplest level that refers to the syntactical repetitions — or even occasional lapses — that signal the viva voce form of his prose; at another level he contextualizes matters for an audience of students who are not expected to have read his whole oeuvre, rendering the ideas more accessible sometimes simply by making shorthand reference to his other writings, but at other times by explaining something (such as the classical deconstructive strategy just discussed) in more detail than one would expect. At still another level, by obeying the particular temporal constraints of thirteen times two hours — we know how his public lectures did or did not respect reigning protocols of duration — these seminars demonstrate both the breadth and richness of Derrida’s material and perspectives, and his attention to a necessarily long arc of logical development. Thus, although he is constantly deferring discussion of matters that he has repeatedly promised to address, and therefore considerably modifying his syllabus as he goes, each session still maintains an evident integrity and coherence, and covers as it were a finite set of data. That integrity and coherence were effected in practice by the discipline he imposed on himself, during by far the greater part of his teaching career, of writing out his lectures in long hand (handwritten from 1960-69, typed and annotated by hand from 1969-87, word processed from 1987-2003). The final level at which his pedagogy shows through is that of explicit references to teaching: relations between a seminar and a fable (24, 34-35), the professor and the sovereign (or werewolf) (78-79), philosophy and anatomical dissection (284-85), or a glimpse into his class preparation (335).

The opening session of this volume dates from just three months after 9/11. Derrida has persistent recourse to the figure of the wolf in order to insist on the sovereign’s capacity for suspending the law, for therefore resembling an animal, an outlaw, acting like a wild beast, wolf or werewolf:

one cannot be interested in the relations of beast and sovereign, and all the questions of the animal and the political, of the politics of the animal, and man and beast in the context of the state, the polis, the city, the republic, the social body, the law in general, war and peace, terror and terrorism, national or international terrorism, etc., without recognizing some privilege in the figure of the ‘wolf’ (9).

His insistence is particularly topical in the period between invasions of Afghanistan and Iraq (the final seminar of his life, to appear in Vol. II, dates from March 26, 2003). In that respect he reinforces from the very first the explicit critique, inspired by Chomsky and developed in Rogues (whose essays date from summer 2002), of the United States’ readiness to accuse other countries of being rogue states when it

is in fact allegedly the most rogue of all, the one that most often violates international right [droit, law], even as it enjoins other states (often by force, when it suits it) to respect the international law that it does not itself respect whenever it suits it not to. Its use of the expression ‘rogue state’ would be the most hypocritical rhetorical stratagem, the most pernicious or perverse or cynical armed trick of its permanent resort to the greater force, the most inhuman brutality (19).

And the example from Chomsky upon which Derrida shines the spotlight is the long and complex history of relations between the USA and Saddam Hussein, who, when he no longer conforms to American geopolitical strategy, finds himself transformed into “the Beast of Baghdad” (20). The three opening sessions of this seminar develop, against a background of Hobbes, Schmitt and Machiavelli, both a lycopolitics (lukos, Gk., wolf) of the sovereign as outlaw or brutal beast, and a profound calling into question, from various perspectives, of the concept of the nation-state: for example how the right to supersede it, as in a “humanitarian” intervention, relies on a problematic understanding of what is “proper to man” (70); or more troublingly, how, in Schmitt’s terms, “in the name of the human, of human rights and humanitarianism, other men are then treated like beasts, and consequently one becomes oneself inhuman, cruel, and bestial” (73).

But there is another important side to the relation between sovereign and beast, or rather two sides to another important side. Beginning with La Fontaine’s The Wolf and the Lamb or Hobbes’s Leviathan, the human in its most sovereign moments either borrows the trappings of a fable, or takes the form of an artificial animal, an artificial man that is an animal. The thesis of sovereignty, and the possibility of ipseity in general, is thus found to be inseparable from an idea of artificial contrivance. On the one hand, in the context of the reason of the strongest as incarnated by La Fontaine’s wolf, Derrida advances the hypothesis of political rhetoric as a discourse of sovereignty that is inevitably “a strategy to give meaning and credit to a fable … to a story indissociable from a moral, the putting of living beings, animals or humans, on stage” (35). Yet he by no means limits such rhetoric to discursive operations, finding the same fabulous dimension to determine “political actions, military operations, the sound of arms, the din of explosions and killings, putting-to-death of military and civilians, so-called acts of war or of terrorism” (ibid.). In that context the contemporary example of teletechnologies of information mobilized in the cause of an interminably looped repetition of images, such as those of the collapsing Twin Towers, is understood to have effects as diverse as the affabulation of real death and suffering, the relegation of any number of other human catastrophes to lesser levels of newsworthiness, and especially the phantasmatic haunting of still worse attacks to come.

For what sovereignty trades on above all is fear. Thus, on the other hand, in Leviathan absolute sovereignty functions, and terrifies specifically as “the product of a mechanical artificiality, a product of man, an artifact; and this is why its animality is that of a monster as prosthetic and artificial animal” (27). Hobbes’s commonwealth is a prosthesis, which leads Derrida to call it "prosthstatic [prothétatique]" and to emphasize again what is non-natural, and hence historical and deconstructible about it. Sovereignty as artificial soul (Hobbes again) is like an iron lung that both “amplif[ies] the power of the living” and functions as a “dead machine” (28). It is therefore conventional, contractual, institutional, and mortal; yet, thanks to its prosthetic endurance, it is at the same time posited as immortal. While it supposedly excludes the animal on one side, and God — who has no need of it — on the other, it appears, in its very technoprostheticity, as profoundly ontotheological. For however much Hobbes may have sought to introduce a purely secular conception of sovereignty, his concept of a commonwealth artificially created by a man who is the summit of a nature created as God’s art, retains a structural relation with that divine model.

The articulation of sovereignty within a network that includes both the animal and the artificial, and the animal as artificial, again extends the question concerning the animal to include the relation of living to non-living, with all the political and ethical implications that are so brought to bear. As I suggested earlier,

it is not enough to say that this unconditional ethical obligation, if there is one, binds me to the life of any living being in general. It also binds me twice over to something non-living… . One must therefore inscribe death in the concept of life. And you can imagine all the consequences this would have (110).

The Beast and the Sovereign‘s treatment of the consequences of such a radicalization of the “what lives,” is, as always in Derrida’s work, developed through extensive and detailed readings of a variety of texts. The point regarding ethical obligation is made in the course of analysis of Lacan’s presumption concerning the fellow. Besides others I have already mentioned, one finds readings of Aristotle, Rousseau, Valéry, Heidegger, Celan, D.H. Lawrence, Deleuze, Marin, and Foucault. Such readings can be more or less appreciative and more or less critical. In one case, however — and the possibility of such lapses in tone may have been one reason why Derrida was always reluctant to have his seminars published in raw form — a contemporary thinker of sovereignty, namely Agamben, comes to function for him as something of a bête noire. In a first passage, in Session 3 (92-96), Derrida is distinctly irritated by Agamben’s philological one-upmanship (specifically his claims to being the first to say who was first to say this or that), but one suspects the irritation to be symptomatic of a deeper disagreement. Indeed, a number of pages of the Twelfth Session are dedicated to debate over the zōē/bios opposition on the basis of which Agamben “structure[s] his whole problematic” (315), but which Derrida, referring to both Heidegger and Aristotle, considers to be far less rigorously a distinction between bare life (an “audacious” 326 translation) and individual or group life than Agamben contends. By extension, Derrida finds himself fundamentally at variance with Agamben’s understanding of the biopolitical (and here he both defends and critiques Foucault), implying that Agamben has failed to acknowledge the breadth of the question concerning “what lives” that Derrida develops over these 350 pages. Because Agamben’s formulation has been accepted as common currency in much contemporary debate, no doubt partly thanks to his apparent philological authority, The Beast and the Sovereign should serve to relaunch that important discussion (I should add that Derrida’s comments are restricted to Homo Sacer and he does not address Agamben’s later development of the logic of the camp). For that reason, therefore, but more generally because the question of what lives has never been more important, this book is compulsory reading.

The Beast and the Sovereign is, of course, a translation. Translators, Derrida writes here, repeating something he has often said, “are always the most vigilant and formidable readers” (22). From the pen of one such reader, Geoffrey Bennington, comes this first rendition in a series that will require more than a single generation of scholars to produce. The standard is therefore set for many years to come.