The Beast and the Sovereign, Volume II

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Jacques Derrida, The Beast and the Sovereign, Volume II, Geoffrey Bennington (tr.), University of Chicago Press, 2011, 293pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226144306.

Reviewed by Alexander García Düttmann, Goldsmiths (University of London)


In the second volume of Jacques Derrida's last lecture course, The Beast and the Sovereign, faithfully translated into English by Geoffrey Bennington, the question addressed is that of loneliness: "What do 'being alone' and 'I am alone' mean?" (7), Derrida asks in the beginning.

On a thematic level, the question is addressed by way of a detailed reading of Defoe's Robinson Crusoe and an equally thoughtful inquiry into Heidegger's explication of solitude and the world as fundamental concepts of metaphysics. Some of the lectures or "sessions" are also devoted to Rousseau, Celan and Blanchot. Early on Derrida establishes a link between the course's main topic and loneliness: "The sovereign is alone (sovereign) or is not" (8). In other words, loneliness belongs to the very definition of sovereignty, as an expression of the indivisibility on which sovereignty depends. Derrida returns to this statement in the last session when commenting upon the "ultra-sovereignty" or the "excess of sovereignty" of Heideggerian Walten, a sovereignty stripped bare of its "anthropological, theological and ontical . . . dimensions", as Walten concerns the very event of difference, the differing of Being from beings, and hence the limits of onto-theology: "But what does 'excess of sovereignty' mean, if sovereignty, in essence and by vocation, by its structure, signals and signifies itself primarily as excess, as normal abuse, as surplus and transcendence beyond . . .  any determinable measure?" (279). It is thus not by chance that the sovereign is and must remain alone, and that declaring oneself sovereign, or a sovereign, is tantamount to saying "I am alone". Derrida seems to suggest that to understand something of the experience of loneliness, one needs to turn to sovereignty, both a unique experience and an experience of uniqueness.

On the level of Derrida's own teaching, the question of loneliness is addressed when he asks his audience in a straightforward manner: "Do you find it interesting to listen to what I am saying and then to read Robinson Crusoe differently?" (87f.) What prompts this question is an insight into the impossibility of adducing external criteria so as to justify a proposed reading. All readings, Derrida says, consist in bringing out "anachrony, non-self-contemporaneity, dislocation in the taking-place of the text." Otherwise a text would rule sovereign and would have to be left alone, rendering any reading of it impossible. But there is no way of determining from the outside when such a "bringing-out" succeeds or fails. It must appeal to others. Presumably, this appeal will only show in that they too will try to read the text and, in doing so, look for, and produce, a different "dislocation", one that in their eyes will do as much justice as possible to the "taking-place of the text". One cannot but be tempted to detect the paradox of otherness in this loneliness of the reader. Derrida puts it like this: "Now, the more the other is other, the less it is other. Conversely, the less it is other, the more it is other." (138) It is the other's proximity, his family resemblance, that intensifies the otherness, for an otherness that would be nothing except other would be either an indifferent otherness, an otherness that leaves me untouched, or a recognised otherness, an otherness that my own sense of the familiar, my own familiarity with myself, has already identified as otherness.

Reading, then, moves from "dislocation" to "dislocation", or from "island" to "island", and its success lies in that it triggers such a movement, that it elicits the courage to move to another shore which must be "the courage of one's fear" (147). So there would be the loneliness of a reading that fails to engage the reader because no other reading is proposed, neither by the reader nor by the one whom he is reading, and there would also be the loneliness of a reading that succeeds in engaging the reader but only because it is itself other, different. Hence, when Derrida asks his audience whether his reading manages to be engaging, whether it performs and achieves something, he does not simply ask those who are listening to him whether they are willing to read "differently" in the same way in which he reads "differently", but whether they want to read "differently" from the way in which he reads "differently".

"There is no world, there are only islands" (9), Derrida writes as he paraphrases, or reads, a verse by Paul Celan. While he concedes that it will never be possible to demonstrate rigorously that two human beings "inhabit the same world" (265), he also observes that the idea of a "radical dissemination" that undoes the world as a common and shared place and leads to an "irremediable solitude without salvation" (266) must still let itself be guided by a "presumption" that the world has a certain unity. This is why loneliness is perhaps never such that it cannot reveal itself both in the attempt to carry the other outside of the world, beyond the "as-if" of "phantasm" (148) that survives the absolute loneliness of death, into a space where "we share at least this knowledge without phantasm that there is no longer a world, a common world" (268), and in the attempt to behave "as if" there were a world, to make "the world come to the world" for the other, to present the other with the poetic gift of an "as-if", or of a "presumption".

It thus appears that, in Derrida's thought, the question of loneliness is indeed a question: "Does solitude distance one from others?" (104). Not only would the mere fact of solitude not "distance" me from others; the very utterance "I am alone" is ambiguous, for it may in fact bring me closer to the other. While Derrida acknowledges that it is not the same to say "I am alone" and "I am the only one" (62), thereby stressing the difference between abandonment and sovereignty, he admits that things can easily become more complicated. For what if one said "'I am alone' and 'moreover I'm the only one', in truth, 'I'm the only one to be alone', 'the only one to be so alone'"? What emerges from the second part of The Beast and the Sovereign is that the sovereign, while alone, can never be lonely, a figure that expresses his loneliness, since the moment he does so, he compromises his sovereignty. At best, the sovereign can only be a cipher.

Which of the often inseparable aspects of Derrida's meandering and engaging analysis of loneliness can be told apart? There is the aspect of a loneliness inherent in the time of finitude. Because death proves faster than life, because the ineluctable character of its future event means that it also precedes me, everything lived in the present belongs to the past already and may give me pleasure only to the extent that it is already on its way back and that experiencing present pleasure must be considered as the "return of revenance over the track of its own steps" (53). Robinson is "scared by the footprint he is not sure is his own". My enjoyment is shot through with "fright" since I can never know whether it is really my enjoyment: altered by the past from which it returns as a pleasure I experience presently, it may actually "come from the other". Hence the loneliness of finitude is not so much the loneliness of the one who feels severed or at a distance from others, but the even more uncanny loneliness of relinquishing an undisturbed and undivided intimacy with oneself. "Without mourning", Derrida states hyperbolically, "and the mourning of myself, the mourning of my 'I am present', there would be no pleasure. There would not even be an 'I am', consciousness, cogito, I think, or present enjoyment of my Cartesian-Robinsonian existence."

Then, there is the aspect of a loneliness inherent in the collapse of lived experience into automatism. In his reading of Defoe's novel, Derrida pays special attention to the connection between Robinson's prayer and his invention, or reinvention, of the wheel, of a "wheel-barrow" and of a "potter's wheel", of a machine that "works on its own by turning on itself" (78), and that will help Robinson to affirm his sovereignty over nature. An earthquake on his island makes the lonely man feel terrified by the possibility and the prospect of being buried alive, like the author of an "autobiographical fiction" (87) or, more generally, the one who leaves a trace (130). His spontaneous prayer comes across as a "cry that is almost automatic, irrepressible, machinelike, mechanical, like a mainspring calling for help from the depths of panic and absolute terror." (77f.) Prayer, Derrida adds, is always addressed to someone who remains unknown, to "nobody", as if praying followed a double movement, a movement of spontaneity, or "auto-affection", that testifies to the liveliness of the praying subject, perhaps even reaffirms his sovereignty, and a mechanical movement, or automatism, that thwarts spontaneity, brings death to life, and contaminates the identity of selfhood with otherness: it shows the unique and the singular to be split by repetition, and a beastly prosthesis, a parrot, to lurk in the sovereign's ipseity. Is this also the reason why, as Derrida stresses much later in his lecture course, prayers can be heard as a sort of "call to resurrection" (204), and why there cannot be loneliness, a "Cartesian-Robinsonian existence", without prayer?

In a time when deconstruction seems to be more lonely than ever, will Derrida's prayer go unheard?