The Beautiful Shape of the Good: Platonic and Pythagorean Themes in Kant's Critique of the Power of Judgment

Placeholder book cover

Fistioc, Mihaela C., The Beautiful Shape of the Good: Platonic and Pythagorean Themes in Kant's Critique of the Power of Judgment, Routledge, 2002, 160pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415938694.

Reviewed by Steve Naragon, Manchester College


Mihaela Fistioc’s The Beautiful Shape of the Good builds a case that Plato and, ultimately, Pythagoras, helped inspire Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment. Apart from this exercise in the history of philosophy, she offers an engaging study of the relation between the beautiful and the moral, and the centrality in our lives of aesthetic experience.

We respond with pleasure to beauty in the world, whether it be of natural or of human origin, and we expect others to respond likewise. Both of these facts about us are cause for some wonder, since one might just as readily imagine a race of beings emotionally indifferent to their surroundings. And who would suspect that something as private as one’s own personal responses of pleasure would demand such high claims on objectivity that we hold others to experience the world similarly? Yet we do routinely encounter this intersubjective agreement of pleasure—both as a demand and in fact—all of which suggests a deep linkage between our aesthetic impulse and the world around us. The beautiful, the good, and the surprising fit between the world and our desire to understand are brought together in Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790). In the current book under review, a lightly re-worked doctoral dissertation (Chicago, 2000), these Kantian themes are explored and traced back to Greece in chapters on (1) Kant’s exposure to Pythagorean and Platonic thought, (2) Plato’s Symposium discussion of love, beauty, and the ascent to virtue, and (3) Kant’s parallel attempts in the third Critique of relating beauty and the good. While linked thematically, these chapters read nearly like separate studies, and I will discuss them as such.

In chapter one, Fistioc admits the lack of clear evidence that Kant read any of Plato’s dialogues (for instance, none were listed in his estate library, nor is the internal evidence compelling), although she notes his likely access to Latin translations at the university library where he served as an assistant librarian (1766-72), as well as to the German translations being published in the early 1780s. But apart from any direct acquaintance Kant may have had with the dialogues, we also know he was familiar with Jakob Brucker’s famous Historia critica philosophiae (Leipzig, 1742-44; 2nd ed: 1767)—Brucker is cited in the Critique of Pure Reason (A 316/B 342)—and Fistioc offers a suggestive account of how Kant might have acquired here much of his understanding of Plato and Pythagoras. To explore this possibility, she outlines Brucker’s discussion (pp. 12-35), highlighting Pythagoras’s use of symbolism, his discovery of the mathematical ratios of the harmonic scales (and specifically, the connection between pleasure and form), and the use of beauty in the moral education of the soul. This last point is built around a brief comment appearing in several versions of Kant’s logic lectures (L2, Vienna, and Jäsche) that Pythagoras “moderated or purified religion of its folly, introducing lawfulness”—as though the lawfulness of mathematics eventually migrated into the very lives of the mathematicians.

It is of some interest that Brucker’s history devoted more pages to Pythagoras than it did to Plato (120 and 103, respectively), and a few of Kant’s reviews of the history of philosophy are similar in this respect (although overall, Kant refers to Plato rather more often than he does to Pythagoras). Kant seemed especially taken by the Pythagorean understanding of the soul as a self-moving number, a notion listed in Brucker’s index (under ‘anima’), and which then appears in several of Kant’s texts: in his essay “On a Newly Arisen Superior Tone in Philosophy” of 1796 (Ak. 8: 392), but also in the K2 metaphysics notes (early 1790s; Ak. 28: 753) and the Blomberg logic notes (early 1770s; Ak. 24: 36). The suggestion here is that Pythagoras was connecting the form of the mathematical ratios of various musical tones with the pleasure elicited by these formal features. The form is experienced as beautiful, thus filling the soul with pleasure. Music can affect the soul because both are a kind of form— thus, form affecting form. But now this mystery: Why should one mathematical ratio evoke pleasure, and another not?

Kant also saw Pythagoras and Plato as exemplars of the deep human interest in metaphysics, with the root error arising from an illicit coupling of mathematics with metaphysics. Success in the former made them overly confident in the latter, making use of the same method and hoping to be rewarded with similar . priori intuitions — this cautionary tale is found throughout Kant’s metaphysics lectures, as well as in the “Doctrine of Method” of the Critique of Pure Reason (1781) and in the “Superior Tone” essay (1796).

One small fault with this otherwise engaging chapter lies with an undue bother over the dating of Kant’s first encounter with Pythagoras and Plato. The goal here, of course, was to strengthen the plausibility that a central concern of the Critique of the Power of Judgment found its inspiration in Pythagoras, and thus that Kant’s awareness of Pythagoras pre-dates the composition of the Critique. To this end, the author made nice use of some of the metaphysics and logic student notes (pp. 49-56); but noticing that a discussion of Pythagoras also appears in the Blomberg logic notes (early 1770s; Ak. 24: 31-36) would have saved the author and the reader some trouble. At the same time, given her concern with the genesis of Kant’s ideas, it is unfortunate that she neglected the extensive discussions on pleasure, taste, and the beautiful that can be found in the “empirical psychology” section of the metaphysics notes, ranging from the early L1 notes of the mid-1770s to the late Vigilantius notes of 1794-95.

Chapter two provides a useful analysis of Plato’s Symposium, connecting the discussion of love with the Pythagorean insight that certain patterns are a source of pleasure. Fistioc presents the Symposium as an allegory of the human condition and as an inquiry into the best way to live, with each participant representing a different stage of understanding or moral development, and each guided, after his own fashion, by love (eros). Love as a longing for oneness, described in Aristophanes’ speech as forever foundering on human brokenness, becomes able—in the Myth of Diotima—to make humans once again whole. In this myth, as recounted by Socrates, love involves not only need, but also the resourcefulness to free us from a doomed, blind groping after wholeness. We are initially attracted to others by an outer or lesser beauty, but what we desire in the end is wisdom and the good. First we love a body, but then we discover that the beauty we love is not in this or that body as such, but rather in their form or symmetry, thus cracking open a door into the universal. And while in love with this particular, we also discover for the first time a selfless concern for the beloved, and so a concern for the other in general, thus developing an understanding of the social laws—in Kantian terms, we become able to make these laws our own, and thus to become self-legislators. We are attracted by something offering both pleasure and understanding, and this we find in a form—at first physical, but later more abstract. Beauty becomes a kind of lawfulness; to experience beauty is to respond with pleasure to the discovery of a right proportion or intelligible form. Or as Fistioc sums it up, “When in love one has new eyes, and with these new eyes one can see the structure of the world in a way one could not see it before” (p. 95).

This reading of Plato prepares us for her interpretation of Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment, which she develops in the third chapter. The Pythagoreans discovered that certain mathematical ratios resulted in pleasing forms, and in this chapter Fistioc argues that Kant’s account of beauty rests principally on an analysis of this pleasurable response to form. The upshot of her reading of this analysis, as I understood it, is as follows: We are able to find meaning in the world by regularly inserting purposiveness (viewing things as though they came from the hand of a designing intelligence), and we want to find meaning in the world because doing so gives us pleasure; what is more, we often discover that others find the same meaning that we do. In laying out her case, Fistioc finds a good fit between Plato’s notion of love (as developed primarily in the “Myth of Diotima”) and Kant’s reflecting power of judgment (as developed in the third Critique): both of these motivate and guide us, and ultimately point beyond to the moral order.

One small point here: Given the amount of work asked of the reflecting judgment in this chapter, I think many readers would have benefited from a more explicit discussion of how it differs from a determining judgment (pp. 104-5); for instance, Fistioc might have offered the parallel notions of regulative and constitutive principles (such as given at Ak. 5: 361, 379). As I understand this, all judgments serve to introduce some kind of unity, and determining judgments are what unify the intuited given into the objects of experience (they “constitute” the objects). As such, however, this still leaves us with a rather chaotic jumble for a world—far too disordered for constructing a human life—and so we routinely go about inserting further unities or orderings into what we experience by making reflecting judgments. These reflecting judgments are free acts of the imagination; they do not constitute the way the world “really is,” but they do help make sense of the experienced world—they fill it with meaning. What is striking here is that we so often succeed in these reflecting judgments and, what is more, that they often correspond with the judgments of others.

At the theoretical level, we realize that the world could have been wholly inscrutable and opaque to our minds; that instead it is knowable, with “an order that we can grasp” (Ak. 5: 185), is due to this reflecting power of judgment. At the practical level, Fistioc notes that we are often unhappy—”satisfaction with one’s whole existence is not, as it were, an original possession” (Critique of Practical Reason, Ak. 5: 25)—nor is it clear what happiness is. But out of this confusion comes a plan: “Just as Plato describes a lower eros but also a higher one, so Kant, by the time he writes the third Critique, has worked out the details of a type of pleasure which is not a source of confusion but rather a guide” (p. 109)—namely, the pleasure felt in the discovery of form and purpose in the world. At the heart of this discovery is the formation of concepts by the reflecting judgment, wherein we find a meaningless heap transformed into a meaningful system, and thereby experience beauty (p. 132). What is more, this concept formation is a free, creative act of the imagination, and we soon discover ourselves in a community of others experiencing the same beauty, and getting there through their own spontaneous acts. Taste is communicable with others, and beauty becomes “a revelation of community … Another person’s understanding of, say, a novelist’s vision of beauty is concrete proof to all involved that solitude does not, after all, have to be our lot in life” (p. 135).

Finally, we find beauty bridging the gap between the sensible (the empirical, the realm of science) and the supersensible (the rational, the realm of morality). As Kant put it, “the beautiful is the symbol of the morally good” (Ak. 5: 353) and serves as a bridge for crossing over that “great chasm separating the supersensible from the appearances” (Ak. 5: 195). Fistioc explains this by noting again two necessary conditions for getting on in this world: the need to make sense of things (finding patterns, forms, order) and the need to be reliably motivated in our pursuit of various projects in the world. What we discover is that we can find meaning in the world and that we experience pleasure when we do. Neither nature nor our response is chaotic or random. A comment near the close of the book sums this up well: “Our constant search for beauty comes down to the hope that the world is amenable to intelligent interpretation and action” (p. 142). But how does this involve an ascent to morality? The author interprets the gap-bridging problem as concerning how reason might influence nature or, alternatively, how “what ought to be” might influence “what is.” But if the creation of meaning (the conceptualization of the world by way of reflecting judgments) just is our free imposition on “what is” of how the world ought to be, then the job is done. These reflecting judgments make constant use of the regulative principle of purposiveness—an appeal to the supersensible for understanding the sensible—and since this use pervades our daily experience, we find that “what is” is shot through with “what ought to be.”

In closing, I should admit that I responded with pleasure to much of what was presented in this book—especially to the linking of aesthetic experience with the formation of community—and hope the author can continue these explorations in the future.