The Birth of Ethics: Reconstructing the Role and Nature of Morality

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Philip Pettit, The Birth of Ethics: Reconstructing the Role and Nature of Morality, Kinch Hoekstra (ed.), Michael Tomasello (comm.),  Oxford University Press, 2018, 387pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190904913.

Reviewed by David Phillips, University of Houston


This book is an expanded version of Philip Pettit's Berkeley Tanner Lectures from 2015. Pettit aims to tell a naturalistic story about the origin of morality. And he claims that his "reconstructive" strategy is an alternative, and a superior alternative, to more standard reductive defenses of ethical naturalism.

The book is conceptually rich. Any moral philosopher will find much to ponder here. To take just one example, Pettit suggests in Chapter Seven that moral theories differ along two dimensions. The first, more familiar one is the contrast between consequentialist and deontological theories. The second is less well recognized, but, he suggests, equally important: a contrast between theories that begin with desirability and theories that begin with responsibility. What I find most interesting in the book are Pettit's methodological claims. Before focusing on them, I need to tell a very abbreviated version of his story.

It is a story of a distinctive, philosophical kind. Pettit's only commentator in the volume, Michael Tomasello, is directly in the evolutionary history business. Tomasello aims to explain, on the basis of regrettably limited evidence, how morality evolved. Questions arise at the end of the volume, in the brief exchange between Pettit and Tomasello, about the extent to which their projects compete. Pettit sketches more than one possibility, but clearly they do compete to some extent. Nonetheless, Pettit is not, in the way Tomasello is, immediately concerned with actual evolutionary history. His story is supposed to tell us not how morality did evolve, but how it "more or less had to" evolve. Its setting is "Erewhon" (an anagram of "nowhere", borrowed from Samuel Butler).

The story begins with people like us who live in small, relatively equal groups. We have language with which to make basic factual reports, but no way of prescribing. We are largely self-interested: one of the differences between Pettit's and Tomasello's stories is the extent to which they want to rely at the start on altruistic motivation. The main driver of the series of conceptual and linguistic innovations Pettit sketches is, as he puts it on p. 314, the aim of

securing the benefits associated with mutual reliance . . . [we want] . . . to prove ourselves reliable in our communications with one another, making it possible to rely on others when we need to do so and to get them to rely on us when it is in our interest.

The first steps on the path to prescriptive language and concepts are to introduce what Pettit calls "avowal" and "pledging". When we make primitive reports (about our beliefs, desires, or intentions), we have open to us two kinds of excuses if the reports prove inaccurate: what Pettit calls "misleading mind" and "changed mind" excuses. A misleading mind excuse would say that we were in error about that on which we were reporting; a changed mind excuse would say that conditions have changed since we acquired the evidence on the basis of which we made our report. Pettit argues that it can be strategically advantageous to us to put our reputations on the line by foreclosing appeal to either kind of excuse. If we avow, we foreclose appeal to a misleading mind excuse. If we pledge, we forego appeal to either kind of excuse. Once we can avow and pledge, the next stage in the story is the introduction of co-avowal and co-pledging. With the same basic driver, the importance of mutual reliance and reputation, Pettit argues that we will be led to avow and pledge desires and intentions not just on our own behalf but on behalf of others. Sometimes the others will belong to some particular delineated group. Sometimes the group will be open-ended.

These practices, Pettit argues, lead us into the realm of prescriptive concepts. The key idea in the transition is that when we are prepared to avow a belief or desire, we must think of that belief or desire as appropriately supported: by the data in the case of belief, by the desiderata in the case of desire. If we had not been appropriately careful in our response to the data, we would not be in a position to avow a belief; correspondingly, if we had not been appropriately careful in our response to the desiderata, we would not be in a position to avow a desire. So it will be natural to start thinking in terms of credibility and desirability: of what we ought to believe and what we ought to desire. At this point "we in Erewhon have entered prescriptive space" (164).

So far, the treatments of credibility and desirability, have been parallel. The articulation of the concept of moral desirability involves, however, an important difference between the case of belief and the case of desire. A belief is credible if it is supported by the evidence. And there is no reason to suppose that the evidence for one person is different from the evidence for others. By contrast, the transition from desiderata to moral desirability is not so straightforward. For some attractive features of options will be agent-relative: they will be attractive to some of us but not to others, or more attractive to some of us than to others. The concept of moral desirability must in some way resolve these conflicts, either by filtering out all agent-relative desiderata, or, less drastically, by filtering out all agent-relative desiderata that generate competition. At this point, then, we have reached the first of the key concepts in terms of which, Pettit argues, morality can be understood: the concept of moral desirability.

The second key concept is responsibility, to which Chapter Six is devoted. Pettit begins with an account of the ordinary connotations of a remark, of someone who transgresses a norm, that he or she "could have done otherwise". There are three key connotations: a claim that the agent robustly had the capacity to do otherwise, a retrospective exhortation to have done otherwise, and a reprimand. Pettit then argues that in Erewhon we would come to use the expression "you could have done otherwise" with these three connotations. The driver, as elsewhere, is cooperation and reputational effects. The distinctive twist here is the thought that ongoing cooperation requires some serious marker for bad behavior, but a marker less serious than expulsion from the community. This is the role of these distinctive expressions. Pettit also gives an analysis of the concept of moral obligation in terms of the concepts of moral desirability and responsibility:

It is obligatory for an agent to choose one option rather than another just when it is the morally most desirable alternative among 'erogatory' options: i.e. options that are undemanding enough not to count as supererogatory. (229)

I have, of course, been able here only to give the barest sketch of Pettit's story, which is articulated over the course of more than 180 pages and summarized again over the 30 pages of the Concluding Chapter. There are many interesting details about which much more could be said. Rather than focusing on these details, I want to return to the key methodological claim. Pettit contrasts two different strategies for ethical naturalists. The first is the standard reductive strategy. As he sketches it,

In a familiar relatively strict form, this reduction would involve two claims. First, that what it takes for an ethical property to be instantiated is that this or that set of non-prescriptive conditions are satisfied. And second, that these conditions can be satisfied in the actual world by one or another configuration of broadly naturalistic properties. (20)

The second is the reconstructive alternative:

It starts rather from a naturalistic story about how recognizably ethical terms and concepts could have emerged among creatures of our ilk and could have played a referential, yet prescriptive role in registering bona fide properties in the world. And then it argues on that basis for a naturalistic realism about desirability and responsibility.

The argument involves two claims. First, that insofar as the terms or concepts that emerge in the story respond to the same sorts of prompts, and serve the same sort of purposes, as our actual ethical terms, the properties they predicate are good candidates for the properties we ourselves predicate with them. And, second, that since the appearance of those concepts in a predicative role is naturalistically explicable, the properties they ascribe . . . must be naturalistic too; if the concepts ascribed non-natural properties, after all, then those properties would presumably have played a role in explaining how the concepts came into use. (20)

Pettit's most important example of the reconstructive strategy is an account of the origin of money according to which the need for a medium of exchange and store of value would have led a society without money to begin to treat some widely desired and available commodity (gold, cigarettes, etc.) as money.

It might be argued, however, that the mere availability of a genealogical explanation of our coming to employ a set of terms and concepts does not in itself demonstrate that the properties those terms ascribe are naturalistic. To see this, consider first mathematical concepts. We can imagine an Erewhon story about their acquisition. We start with people quite like ourselves who have no words for numbers, or no words for numbers beyond "one", "two", and "many". We could plausibly explain why it would be advantageous to such people to acquire at least a good range of number concepts and the ability reliably to do arithmetic (to keep track of the numbers of animals in the herd they are hunting, the size of a combination of two groups of hunters, etc.). But does the fact that such a genealogical story is available itself demonstrate that mathematical properties are empirical? Instead, couldn't someone who accepted the genealogical explanation hold that mathematics involved necessary truths about relations between properties that are importantly non-empirical? The mere availability of an Erewhon story about the usefulness of arithmetical concepts doesn't seem to show that that view is false.

Or, second, imagine an Erewhon story about the acquisition of religious beliefs, beliefs of a quite explicitly non-natural kind about powerful entities not subject to the laws of nature. Such beliefs are widespread. Couldn't their existence too be given an Erewhon explanation? We might suppose, in a way that isn't terribly distant from Pettit's appeal to the importance of incentives to prove our reliability, that those who believed in such beings and appealed to them at appropriate points (inter alia by swearing on holy relics or texts rather than merely avowing or pledging) were more likely to be reliable cooperators. But, again, the mere fact that we could tell this story surely would not demonstrate that the religious entities referred to and properties ascribed by those in Erewhon were naturalistic.

So, it might be argued, something more than the mere existence of a plausible Erewhon story is necessary to demonstrate that the concepts whose usefulness the story explains ascribe naturalistic properties. The question then is what the more could be. One obvious initial possibility, which of course Pettit will want to resist, is that the more is a certification via reductive analysis. For then reconstruction isn't really an alternative to reductive analysis: reconstruction depends on the prior reductive certification of the concepts to which it appeals.

One way to press this line of questioning is to focus on moral desirability, and to see Pettit as offering a kind of informed desire account of moral desirability or goodness. Sidgwick famously articulates an account of this sort (though he doesn't ultimately endorse it):

It would seem, then, that if we interpret the notion 'good' in relation to 'desire,' we must identify it not with the actually desired but with the desirable: - meaning by 'desirable' . . . what would be desired, with strength proportioned to the degree of desirability, if it were judged attainable by voluntary action, supposing the desirer to possess a perfect forecast, emotional as well as intellectual, of the state of attainment or fruition. (The Methods of Ethics 110-11)

Pettit's account of moral desirability could be understood as a variant of the kind of account Sidgwick sketches, with different specifications as to the relevant conditions of the desirer: an account in terms of what we would desire if fully informed and if in one of his two ways we omitted the agent-relative desiderata that lead to strife. An account of morality partly in terms of such a property of moral desirability or goodness does indeed seem to that extent naturalistic. But it seems to be so because it involves a naturalistic analysis of moral desirability; the earlier part of the Erewhon story seems irrelevant. The initial worry, then, about Pettit's methodological claims might be framed as a dilemma: either reconstruction depends on reductive analysis, so is not an alternative to it; or reconstruction does not, in the way reductive analysis does, guarantee that the concepts and properties it targets are naturalistic.

The obvious response at this point is that there is something that distinguishes Pettit's genealogy of desirability and responsibility from the genealogical stories I sketched about mathematical and religious properties. But this extra something is not reductive analysis. And, indeed, various elements of Pettit's discussion point to what else the extra something might be. He talks about the genealogical explanations of desirability and responsibility giving judgments about moral desirability and responsibility, naturalistic referents and truth-makers. And he appeals to a distinctive, pattern-based view of the nature of properties to argue that the properties of moral desirability and responsibility are objective, but less significant from a scientific or god's-eye view of things than are physical properties like mass.

Suppose that Pettit has here identified a new strategy of naturalization, distinct from reductive analysis. The question then is whether the genealogy is playing any essential role in this strategy. It might be argued that it is not. Imagine someone who proposes to defend ethical naturalism simply by claiming that the basic moral properties are moral desirability and responsibility, and then arguing that these are naturalistic properties by appeal to the claim that the terms have naturalistic referents and judgments involving naturalistic truth-makers, and that the properties to which these judgments refer are objective properties given a pattern-based conception of properties. Such a person could reject the earlier part of Pettit's genealogical story, and, indeed, refuse to get into the genealogy business at all. If such a person has hit upon a salient alternative to reductive analysis, that alternative does not essentially involve genealogy.

At this point, Pettit would respond that such a person has at least a less adequate strategy of naturalization than reconstruction. It then looks as though the reconstructive strategy is a combination of two elements: genealogy, plus the extra something (not reductive analysis) that distinguishes properly naturalizing genealogical stories from the kind of stories I sketched about mathematical and religious claims. Pettit's view would be that both elements are essential to reconstructive naturalization.

No doubt much more could be said about reconstructive ethical naturalism, as about other central aspects of the project. Pettit is here trying out a novel, multifaceted, and systematic approach to ethics, from which moral philosophers, whether or not they are ultimately persuaded, will have much to learn.


Many thanks to Philip Pettit for very helpful comments.


Sidgwick, Henry. 1981. The Methods of Ethics. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.