The Birth of Hedonism: The Cyrenaic Philosophers and Pleasure as a Way of Life

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Kurt Lampe, The Birth of Hedonism: The Cyrenaic Philosophers and Pleasure as a Way of Life, Princeton University Press, 2015, 277pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691161136.

Reviewed by David Wolfsdorf, Temple University


Kurt Lampe's book is a welcome addition to the literature on ancient hedonism and to our understanding of a lesser-known movement in Greek ethics. It is the first monograph on Cyrenaic ethics in English and, as Lampe claims, the first "systematic reconstruction of Cyrenaic ethics within its own historical contexts" in any language. (2-3)

To be clear, "Cyrenaic" may be used in two ways: one general, one specific. In the specific sense Cyrenaic ethics emerges in the late fifth and early fourth centuries BCE with the Socratic philosopher Aristippus (the elder) and appears to reach a mature theoretical and systematic formulation in the mid to late fourth century with his eponymous grandson (also called the "Metrodidact" (mother-taught) because his mother Aretê, taught by her father Aristippus, in turn taught her son). A number of figures -- in particular Anniceris, Hegesias, and Theodorus -- variously depart from the views of this specific Cyrenaicism, yet are taken to be Cyrenaics in a general sense. I reserve the term "Cyrenaic" for the general sense and follow Lampe in speaking of "mainstream Cyrenaicism" as likely encapsulated in the Metrodidact's formulation.

The book does not have a single overarching argument. It covers the diverse, variously interrelated ethical contributions of the Cyrenaics. As such, the content can hardly be summarized in a relatively short review. I will sketch many of the central ideas and offer some complimentary and critical remarks. 

The book has ten chapters and two appendices. Chapter 1 clarifies the book's methodology and provides an overview of its content. Lampe does not focus on the "painstaking" work of doxographical reconstruction. Instead he presents the reconstructed doxai themselves and arguments supporting them. One of his central aims is to present these results "in their practical and cultural contexts." Another is to show how Cyrenaic ethics was not merely a body of theory, but a form of "spiritual exercise": "I will . . . attempt to think of theory as being in dynamic interaction with pre-philosophical intuitions and the rewarding or disappointing experience of putting doctrines into practice." (5) Indeed,

we should be extremely skeptical that any Cyrenaic ever adheres to a significant ethical position because of the force of reasoning alone. The core positions of each school frame an existential option which is chosen for its positive features, i.e. the satisfying fit between the world it discloses and the inarticulate aspirations of its followers. (7)

In short Lampe aims to present the various configurations of Cyrenaic ethics as forms of life or as existential experiments.

Chapter 2 offers a historical overview of Cyrene in the centuries during which the Cyrenaics were active. It also offers biographical overviews of the philosophers, including their intellectual pedigrees and political connections. Principal among them are: Aristippus the elder, Aretê, Aristippus the Metrodidact, Hegesias, Anniceris, and Theodorus. But Lampe also includes lesser-known Cyrenaics: Antipater, Epiteme, Parabates, Aristoteles, and Aristoxenus, all of Cyrene, as well as Aithiops of Ptolemaïs and Dionysius of Heraclea.

Chapters 3-8 contain the heart of the book, Cyrenaic ethics in its historically varied theoretical-cum-practical or -existential forms.

Chapter 3 has three parts. The first presents Aristippus the elder's non-theoretical hedonism. This amounts to Aristippus' hedonistic lifestyle, as evidenced by ancient anecdotes. Lampe also offers a reasonable argument for Socrates' influence on Aristippus, despite Aristippus' hedonism and a-politicism.

The second part and focus of the chapter discusses the Cyrenaic epistemological ideas that serve Cyrenaic ethics. (Lampe here builds on Voula Tsouna's seminal The Epistemology of the Cyrenaic School.) Fundamental to Cyrenaic epistemology is a distinction between pathê (experiences) and their causes. Pathê include all forms of sensation, but also affect, that is, hedonic and algesic experience. The Cyrenaics hold that pathê themselves and beliefs formed on the basis of them are "unmistakable, true, and incorrigible." (38) In contrast, they maintain that we cannot simply infer from pathê to the content of the external world.

Affective pathê are "at the heart" of Cyrenaic ethics, for pleasure (hedonic pathos) is "satisfying" (eudokêtên) to all animals, while pain (algesic pathos) is repellant (apokroustikon). More precisely, to have a hedonic pathos is to "perceive 'being satisfied (eudokein),'" while to have an algesic pathos is "to perceive 'being repelled (apokrouesthai).'" (41) Consequently, "our infallible and incorrigible experiences of 'satisfaction' and 'repulsion' are the best guides for action and concern." (41) The inference here requires a bridge premise connecting satisfaction and repulsion with value. Lampe provides one: "that which is 'satisfying' involves a perception of what is good for me." (41) Value is thus understood as a kind of welfare. Moreover nothing besides pleasure is an intrinsically satisfying pathos. Hence mainstream Cyrenaic ethics is a form of egoistic hedonism.

The Cyrenaics' skepticism about the nature of the causes of pathê yields a basic practical problem: insofar as we are incapable of apprehending the causes, we lack grounds for pursuit or avoidance. Consequently we have no reason but to be idle and merely hope that pleasure will come our way. Using passages in Sextus, Philodemus, and Diogenes Laertius, Lampe argues that the Cyrenaics addressed this fundamental problem and responded to it by maintaining that "their informational experiences . . . give them the coordinates among which they can attempt to pursue pleasure and avoid pain." (48) Given more space, I would elaborate on this important summarizing statement. But basically "coordinates" here glosses the concept of reasonable practical grounds. The upshot is that Cyrenaics have grounds, although not epistemic ones, for attributing instrumental value to things such as the virtues, wealth, and friendship. How these instrumental values variously figure in Cyrenaic ethics is among the foci of chapters 4 and 6.

The third part of chapter 3 concerns distinct Cyrenaic formulations of the telos. Interestingly, Lampe observes that in the doxography "telos" is used in two ways, both related to the concept of fulfillment or completion. One is the familiar sense having to do with the goal of living. The other is "the fullest, highest, most complete expression of whatever attributes the adjectives 'good,' 'bad,' and 'neither good nor bad' connote." (53) On this second view, pain and distress can be and indeed sometimes are characterized as telê. I'll refer to this sense of telos as generic and to the familiar sense as specific. Lampe's principal interest in the generic sense here relates to the familiar idea that mainstream Cyrenaics were somatic hedonists, yet some expressions of the telos include mental rather than bodily affects. Lampe's solution is that mainstream Cyrenaics regard bodily pleasures as more satisfying, hence more complete, than mental ones.

At the beginning of Chapter 4, Lampe writes "On these foundations the Cyrenaics attempt to construct a theoretical edifice which organizes and justifies an entire way of life devoted to enjoyment and the avoidance of pain and distress." (56) In chapters 4- 6, he examines non-foundational topics of Cyrenaic ethics. Chapter 4 discusses education, wealth, justice, practical wisdom, free speech, and freedom from negative emotion. But its most fundamental concern is happiness (eudaimonia) and the relation between "particular pleasure," that is, a given episode of pleasure, and living a pleasant life. Chapter 5 continues the discussion of the relation between pleasure and happiness. Chapter 6 focuses on interpersonal relationships, in particular friendship, but also political participation.

Chapter 4 begins with Aristippus the elder on education, virtue, and happiness. I will focus on Lampe's discussion of Aristippus on happiness and in particular on Aristippus' presentism. Some testimonies seem to attribute to Aristippus an exclusive concern with the present. Interpreted in one way, such evidence appears to yield a perplexing, indeed absurd conclusion that suggests Aristippus dispensed with practical deliberation, even over the immediate future. Lampe's response is salutary. He argues that there is in fact only one line in one testimony that can be used to support such a view. He further argues that Aristippus' presentism must be understood as a "spiritual exercise" whose aim is to achieve focus on what has intrinsic value and to show that what has intrinsic value is within our power to attain. A central feature of this power or capability is adaptability or versatility. As ancient testimonies suggest, Aristippus is in this respect comparable to Odysseus, a hero whose cunning intelligence, charm, wit, and courage enabled him to make the best of diverse circumstances.

From Aristippean presentism Lampe moves to mainstream Cyrenaic presentism. He argues that for mainstream Cyrenaics living pleasantly is the specific telos. This prima facie unremarkable claim is in fact substantive and controversial. Several scholars have argued that mainstream Cyrenaicism is anti-eudaimonistic: that mainstream Cyrenaics reject the standard Greek ethical thesis that the specific telos is a certain sort of life and instead maintain that the telos is particular pleasure. Analogous to his treatment of Aristippean presentism, Lampe defends mainstream Cyrenaicism as eudaimonistic: the mainstream Cyrenaics avoid long-term planning, but they do so precisely because this serves to secure their long-term happiness.

In support of anti-eudaimonistic interpretations is a passage in Diogenes Laertius' doxography that explicitly claims that the Cyrenaics think "the telos differs from happiness, since a particular pleasure is a telos, but happiness is the composition of particular pleasures." (88-89, citing DL 2.87) In appendix 2, his principal engagement in doxographical reconstruction, Lampe argues that this passage is an Annicerian interpolation In any case, Lampe maintains, Anniceris' anti-eudaimonism is "disingenuous." (101) For instance, Anniceris accords friendship special value (a topic to which I'll return).

Chapter 5 functions as a sort of appendix to the discussion of the Cyrenaics' views of the relation between pleasure and happiness. Lampe canvasses four anti-eudaimonistic interpretations of mainstream Cyrenaicism (Terence Irwin's, Tim O'Keefe's, James Warren's, and Fred Feldman's) and explains where they go wrong. He concludes that the Cyrenaics, "like all other ancient Greek philosophers, care about their lives in their entirety." (101)

Chapter 6 focuses on the Cyrenaics' various views of friendship, which Lampe glosses as an enduring voluntary relationship of mutual affection and support. Lampe also explores Cyrenaic views of benefaction (euergesia), gratitude (kharis), enmity (ekhthra, misos), and political participation and patriotism. His discussion begins with Aristippus the elder, then turns to mainstream Cyrenaicism, Hegesias, Theodorus, and Anniceris.

As I suggested earlier, Aristippus and the Cyrenaics basically view friendship as having instrumental value. Hegesias and Theodorus advance more extreme views: that friendship is useless or simply impossible. The chapter concludes (a-chronologically) with Anniceris' defense of the possibility and value of friendship. In fact Anniceris maintains that friendship through good will (eunoia) may persist even when mutual utility ceases. This view seems to yield a contradiction -- a different one from that related to Anniceris' explicit anti-eudaimonism -- insofar as Anniceris is also committed to the view that the only thing of intrinsic value and hence the only ground for pro-motivation is one's own pleasure. Lampe offers a solution to this problem: once a friendship has been established, you will empathically suffer if your friend does; hence your friend's welfare becomes a source of your own concern and positive feelings.

Chapter 7 focuses on Hegesias' pessimism, specifically on Hegesias' idiosyncratic view that happiness is impossible. (One is reminded of the tragic Greek aphorism that it is better not to have been born.) As Lampe suggests, Hegesias is the only "unambiguous philosophical pessimist" of Greek antiquity (120, my italics). As a Cyrenaic, Hegesias maintains that pleasure is the only complete good and pain the only complete bad. But Hegesias does not hold that pleasure or living pleasantly is the specific telos. Instead, he regards pleasure as the target (skopos) and living neither painfully nor distressingly as the telos. The reason for the distinction: living pleasantly, which Hegesias agrees is happiness, is impossible; but since it is impossible, some other life should be pursued, and that is an analgesic one.

Hegesias' pain-free life, Lampe argues, is in fact a life of indifference, with indifference to be understood here in relation to conventional sources of pleasure. Some such sources include wealth, fame, and social status. But Hegesias' indifference is much more extreme. As mentioned above, its objects include friendship. Accordingly, the Hegesiac sage is self-sufficient. Additionally, and central to Lampe's discussion, Hegesias' indifference extends to life itself. In developing this point Lampe makes use of Cologne Papyrus 205, which comprises fragments of a Socratic dialog. Following Emidio Spinelli, Lampe maintains that the dialog's author is Hegesias. The dialog appears to concern Socrates' decision to accept capital punishment. As Lampe notes, the position here is akin to that in Xenophon's Apology rather than in Plato's since in Xenophon's treatment Socrates does not offer a counter-sentence, i.e., Socrates sees no reason to save himself. In explicating Hegesias' ethics, and particularly radical aspects such as this, Lampe appeals to the heroic virtue of megalopsychia (translated here as "magnanimity", but, importantly, not to be misunderstand in terms of generosity of spirit) and thereby to Aristotle, who speaks of the magnanimous man as disposed to be indifferent to great misfortune. On Lampe's interpretation Hegesias emerges as a solitary philosophical genius, who heroically pursues a pain-free, but not hedonic life, and who is willing, if circumstances compel him, to relinquish his life, with indifference.

Chapter 8 focuses on Theodorus' ethics. Theodorus follows Hegesias (and the Stoics) in maintaining that most of the things his contemporaries value -- freedom, noble birth, fame, wealth, and life -- are indifferent. Unlike Hegesias, Theodorus includes bodily pleasure and pain among indifferents. On the other hand, Theodorus maintains that joy and distress, that is, mental pleasure and pain, are generic telê. Also contrary to Hegesias, Theodorus admits that living pleasantly, in this case joyfully, is possible. Hence Theodorus holds that living joyfully is the specific telos.

Granted Theodorus' generic telê and specific telos, Lampe focuses on the grounds of Theodorus' practical decisions. Central here, Lampe claims, is Theodorus' conception of practical wisdom. Such wisdom does not comprise principles or rules. This is because for Theodorus the "complex and constantly shifting ethical demands of real situations" defy systematization. (153) Instead, the sage must rely on his extemporaneous judgment. Accordingly, Theodorean wisdom appears to consist of an intuitive, discriminatory capacity to do what is best under the appropriate circumstances (kairos). In short, the Theodorean sage has only himself "as a guide to [action]." (157) Here, too, Lampe underscores the heroic virtue of magnanimity. Moreover, the sage's sense of self-worth and achievement are objects of joy.

With chapter 8, Lampe's interpretation of Cyrenaic ethics is essentially complete. Chapter 9 is, therefore, also a kind of appendix. It discusses the "new Cyrenaicism" articulated in Pater's Marius the Epicurean. Lampe suggests that Pater's treatment casts light on several fundamental aspects of Cyrenaic ethics, including, but not limited to, particular pleasure and the relation between virtue and hedonism.

Appendix 1 provides overviews of the principal sources of Cyrenaic ethics. Appendix 2 argues that an Annicerean anti-eudaimonistic doxa has been interpolated in the mainstream Cyrenaic doxography in Diogenes Laertius (2.86-93).

Overall, Lampe's work is philologically, historically, and philosophically well-informed, and is marked by intellectual creativity. Very little has been written on many of the book's topics, especially the Cyrenaics' instrumental values and Hegesias' and Theodorus' ethics. In this domain, where the evidence is so slim, interpretations are unlikely to be decisive. But Lampe's proposals are consistently thoughtful, provocative, and plausible. An excellent orientation to the history of Cyrenaic ethics, his book facilitates further exploration. Its fascinating and sometimes strange topics and its sensitive engagement with them should encourage such exploration.

Let me close by making some critical remarks and suggesting some questions and topics that could or should be pursued or more fully treated. First, what do the Cyrenaics take pleasure to be? Lampe speaks of an experience of satisfaction and a perception of what is good for oneself. The doxography consistently suggests that the Cyrenaics view pleasure as a smooth (leia) motion or change (kinêsis), and pain as a rough (trachus) one. Sometimes a perceptual condition is added: such a motion involves perception (aisthêsis). Lampe does not discuss this definition or characterization. A fortiori he does not discuss what smoothness (and roughness) here might amount to. Given the centrality of pleasure (and pain) to their ethics, this oversight is surprising. Further discussion and defense of the rendition of "eudokêtên" as "satisfying" would also be welcome. One tends to understand pleasure in conjunction with satisfaction as desire-satisfaction. (There is some precedent for this view in Plato's theory of pleasure as replenishment or restoration.) But that interpretation is not required. A slightly different view, attributed to certain Pythagoreans, is suggested by Aristoxenus' Pythagorean Precepts (Stobaeus 3.10.66). Further reason for interest in the nature of pleasure relates to the Annicerean view that pleasure may be taken in the welfare of friends. In this case pleasure has an intentional object. Is this an essential difference between bodily and mental pleasure?

Second, I wonder whether Aristippean hedonism is indeed non-theoretical or largely so. Reason to think that might come by comparison with some arguably non-theoretical Socratics. For example, Lampe has an excellent paper on Aeschines' interpretation of Socratic pedagogy (in Ugo Zilioli's forthcoming From the Socratics to the Socratic Schools). On the other hand, dialectic seems to have been at the center of the historical Socrates' philosophical activity. Lampe even speaks of Aristippus as having "taught" his daughter Aretê. One wonders what such teaching might have amounted to. Certain "spiritual exercises"?

Third, I have kept the phrase "spiritual exercises" in quotation marks throughout my review. I think "spiritual" has the wrong connotation and a misleading association with St. Ignatius. "Psychological exercises" sounds better to me. In any case, I would have liked to hear more about these exercises. For example there is evidence from Cicero's Tusculan Disputations -- of which Lampe is aware -- that the Cyrenaics practiced pre-rehearsing future negative events in order to prepare themselves and disarm potentially damaging psychological effects. Lampe refers to Margaret Graver's discussion of the passage and practice (78), but he is surprisingly brief in his own treatment. Similarly, if Aristippus' presentism also involved psychological exercises, I would have liked some (or more) exploration of what that might have involved. I acknowledge that the evidence here is thin.

More generally, I accept Lampe's methodological hypothesis that Cyrenaic ethics should be understood as much in terms of theory as lived experience or existential experimentation. But ultimately it remains unclear to me just how his treatment presents Cyrenaic ethics as lived experience or existential experimentation any more than typical studies of Greek ethics do. Similarly, I wasn't quite sure what the claim of interpreting Cyrenaic ethics "in its own historical contexts" really amounted to. By this I just mean that I didn't find significantly more investment in historical and contextual situation than I would have expected from a scholar working in ancient philosophy (as opposed to, say, Fred Feldman). To be clear -- Lampe's historical and context investment is good -- just not especially distinctive qua contemporary work in ancient ethics.

Fourth, a word on Cyrenaic eudaimonism versus anti-eudaimonism. Lampe explains how the Cyrenaic conception of the telos as living pleasantly fulfills three Aristotelian conditions on a specific telos -- finality, comprehensiveness, and sufficiency -- in a nutshell as follows: a pleasant life is final insofar as "all other practical decisions are traceable to this end"; it is comprehensive insofar as "it subsumes and organizes all the subordinate ends"; and it is sufficient insofar as "we desire nothing further." (86) My question is how these points square with the claim in the doxography that pleasure is intrinsically choiceworthy (hairetê kath' or di' hautên). Lampe suggests that "intrinsically worth choosing" is to be understood as that which self-evidently motivates pursuit. (42) (I'd note that since the Cyrenaics admit that our motivations may be variously corrupted, this view might need refinement to specify what naturally as well as self-evidently motivates pursuit.) In any case, it appears to follow that happiness is not intrinsically choiceworthy. That is a surprising result. I see two lines of response. One is that happiness does in fact self-evidently motivate pursuit, but differently than particular pleasure does. Alternatively "intrinsically choiceworthy" may be used in more than one way. Indeed, Lampe admits that "choiceworthy" is "not always used by the Cyrenaics of an experience whose self-evident content motivates pursuit" (42). However, the issue here is not merely the meaning of "choiceworthy," but "intrinsically choiceworthy." A further question is what the relation is between the way happiness fulfills the sufficiency condition (we desire nothing further) and the way that pleasure is satisfying. Perhaps I have overlooked answers that Lampe offers to these questions. But if I haven't, then they seem to me worth further reflection.

Fifth, Lampe's chapter on Pater is, in itself, a sensitive and thoughtful reading of Marius the Epicurean, or those portions of it pertinent to Cyrenaic ethics. But I question whether a discussion of Pater was the best use of the brief penultimate chapter. Perhaps some other option should have been pursued. For example, one might have considered Cyrenaic views of pleasure and its value in relation to some earlier or contemporaneous theories: Democritus', Plato's, Aristotle's, or Epicurus'. Alternatively, following the treatments of Hegesias and Theodorus and the centrality of indifference to both of their ethics, one might have discussed indifference, especially Stoic indifference, and its background. I hasten to say that Lampe's discussion is peppered with references to and not infrequently more substantially engaged with numerous Hellenistic figures and ideas. But if a sustained treatment of any other figure would have served to clarify Cyrenaic hedonism, that figure is Epicurus.

Lampe might have explored a very different path, the doxographical one. I agree that devoting the book to doxographical reconstruction would have constituted an entirely different project, one for a more limited audience. However, a chapter reflecting on the pedigree of the principal doxography, Diogenes Laertius', or some parts of that doxography would have been welcome. Relatedly, as Lampe notes in passing, passages in Seneca (Ep. mor. 89.12) and Sextus (M 7.11) attribute a division of subfields of ethics to the Cyrenaics. It would have been interesting to consider the pedigree of this division or its intelligibility in light of all the detailed exegesis of Cyrenaic ethics that Lampe offers. His discussion basically moves from epistemological foundations to affective pathê to non-foundational values, with a parallel movement from Aristippus to mainstream Cyrenaicism to divergent figures. To what extent do these movements correlate with the doxography generally? And to what extent do the Cyrenaic divisions of ethics (as reported in Seneca and Sextus) correspond to topical distinctions that Lampe's engages?

Lastly, I said that since the book is a history of Cyrenaic ethics, it is understandable that such a study would not contain an overarching argument. It occurs to me, though, that it may have a leitmotiv that might be more explicitly recognized: how one gets, both epistemologically and ethically, from the present to the rest of one's life.